Discrete or Continuous? The Quest for Fundamental Length in Modern Physics

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Amit Hagar, Discrete or Continuous? The Quest for Fundamental Length in Modern Physics, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 276pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107062801.

Reviewed by Vincent Lam, University of Lausanne


The issue of whether space (or spacetime) is fundamentally discrete or continuous has a long and venerable history at the intersection of mathematics, philosophy and physics, and lies at the heart of the current research in quantum gravity. Amit Hagar considers several episodes of this history, from Zeno's paradox of extension to important debates in the development of quantum field theories and to the little discussed correspondence between Einstein and W. F. G. Swann, before turning to the current debate in quantum gravity. A central thesis of the book is that certain spacetime and geometrical notions such as (fundamental) length are irreducible and have to be taken as primitive, on pain of epistemic incoherence. This is a recently much discussed topic in quantum gravity, where claims about the 'disappearance of spacetime' are not uncommon. Hagar's aim is very (too?) ambitious, touching many foundational issues in fundamental physics and in the history and philosophy of modern physics.

After the introduction, Hagar first discusses several standard arguments in the history and philosophy of mathematics for and (mainly) against the continuum (chapter 2): Zeno's paradox of extension and Grünbaum's discussion of it, (alleged) conceptual issues with collisions in a continuum, Weyl's tile argument against discrete geometrical approximations of the continuum, among others. Hagar is rightly critical about arguments that aim to show a priori that physical space must be discrete (or continuous), as a matter of logical consistency. Indeed, the criteria for the question of spatial (or spatio-temporal) discreteness to be genuinely empirical constitute a central theme of the book.

In chapter 3, Hagar considers in more detail the philosophical conception of finitism, according to which there can be no actual infinity. One common worry with finitism is that it possibly blurs the distinction between ontology (or metaphysics) and epistemology. Another is that in many cases in physics it merely amounts to some kind of operationalism. This chapter aims to alleviate those worries, mainly by arguing that these possible consequences of finitism are not that bad after all. In particular, Hagar seems happy to endorse an operationalist approach to quantum theory, which is "agnostic about metaphysics" and according to which "measurement outcomes are taken to be primitive notions'' (44). However, he may well be underestimating the implications of this agnostic attitude, for instance for the interpretation of quantum gravity (chapter 7).

Hagar links the operationalist epistemology of finitism with the epistemic precedence of certain geometrical (and 'measurable') notions, such as length or segment. "Without a primitive notion of "segment" in the first place, one cannot make contact between the dynamics and experience, since, as a matter of fact, the only kinds of things we can measure are various sorts of segments" (47). According to Hagar, such a conception about the primacy of certain geometrical notions, which was endorsed by Einstein (as argued in more details in chapter 6), does not rest on a priori arguments, as within some Kantian framework, but merely encodes a fundamental epistemic constraint. In many respects, this view is closely related to J. S. Bell's notion of 'local beables' (Bell 1987, ch. 7) and to the recently much discussed 'primitive ontology' approach to the interpretation of quantum theory (Allori et al. 2008). Hagar makes no explicit link with this debate on the ontology of quantum theory, probably because of the above mentioned operationalist attitude (Bell's point of view is alluded to in few places, e.g., pp. 130-131). To some extent, this is a bit unfortunate, since it seems relevant to the current debate on the fundamental status of spacetime notions in quantum gravity (discussed in chapter 7).

The fact that spatial (or spatio-temporal) continuity involves actual infinity and lies at the root of several divergences (at small scale) is often taken as a motivation for looking for discrete alternatives, such as introducing a fundamental length, and this is especially salient in the development of field theories. Chapters 4 and 5 address some of the conceptual difficulties that arose with the early attempts to introduce a notion of fundamental length in the field-theoretic context and with the early attempts to construct a theory of discrete spacetime. Hagar emphasizes in particular the tension for the proponents of spatial discreteness between, on the one hand, the constraint of consistency with the experimental evidence so far and, on the other hand, the need for novel predictions in different (high energy) regimes -- novel predictions that can possibly violate empirically successful principles (so far), such as Lorentz invariance, for instance (this tension is further discussed in chapter 8 in the context of the difficult issue of quantum gravity phenomenology). Within this framework, Hagar rightly highlights the importance of making a distinction between two ways of interpreting the introduction of a fundamental length: according to the ontological understanding, it is about the structure of spacetime itself, whereas according to the epistemic understanding, it is about the limits of our ability to gain knowledge of the spacetime structure at small scales.

In chapter 6, Hagar provides a detailed historical and philosophical analysis of the little discussed correspondence between Einstein and Swann in the context of the distinction between principle and constructive approaches to the theory of special relativity (and to physical theories in general). Based on an exegesis of Einstein's letter to Swann in January 1942, Hagar argues that Einstein's ambivalent attitude with respect to the constructive approach is mainly due to his deep conviction that certain geometrical notions, such as length, are irreducible and cannot be dispensed with; in particular, these notions cannot be derived from the dynamical behaviour of 'rods' and 'clocks', since any meaningful conception of these latter seem to make use of such geometrical notions, which are therefore best considered as primitive.

Hagar extends these considerations about the primacy of certain spacetime and geometrical notions such as length (the "thesis L") from the context of special relativity to the more general context of quantum gravity. In chapter 7, he briefly reviews the main research programs in quantum gravity (string theory, loop quantum gravity, causal set theory, analogue gravity) and aims to show that they all rely on some primitive spacetime and geometrical notions, in particular a primitive notion of length. If there is some intuitive power underlying Hagar's "thesis L" (again, which is, to some extent, very similar to the intuition underlying Bell's notion of local beables), his discussion of the primacy of the notion of length in various approaches to quantum gravity is a bit superficial; a more detailed discussion of this important and recently much debated issue would have been very helpful. Indeed, the precise meaning of the notion of primitive length and its justification in the various quantum gravity theories under consideration requires a deeper analysis. Furthermore, there is a tension in Hagar's argument against the claims about the "disappearance" of spacetime in quantum gravity. On the one hand, it seems that his aim is to show that his thesis L is vindicated in the various approaches to quantum gravity, against the ontological claims about the "disappearance" of spacetime. On the other hand, his operationalist stance with respect to quantum theory in general seems to prevent him from investigating the ontology of these quantum gravity theories in the first place.

The general justification for thesis L, that is, for the primacy of certain spacetime and geometrical notions (in particular the notion of length), would also have benefited from a more detailed discussion. As mentioned above, the threat of empirical incoherence has been raised in the context of the ontology of quantum mechanics (Maudlin 2007) and has been recently addressed within the framework of quantum gravity (Huggett and Wüthrich 2013). In this context, an interesting suggestion to avoid the threat of empirical incoherence is the following: the idea is that no such empirical incoherence would arise if the spacetime quantities and features that are at the basis of our empirical evidence could be functionally reproduced in some sense by the fundamental non-spatio-temporal, non-geometrical entities of the fundamental (e.g., quantum gravity) theory under consideration. The expectation is that these latter could play the right sort of causal, functional role in order to ground our empirical evidence. Of course, such a proposal needs to be worked out in detail and in concrete cases in order to see whether it can meet the challenge of empirical incoherence, but there is no a priori argument that such a functional strategy could not succeed.

Hagar's book discusses many foundational issues linked to the notion of fundamental length in physics. It provides a nice historical and conceptual background for the contemporary discussion and contains very interesting insights into the history of the introduction of the notion of fundamental length into modern physics. This book will be of interest to historians and philosophers of physics, as well as to physicists interested in the foundations of spacetime physics and quantum gravity.


Allori, Valia, Sheldon Goldstein, Roderich Tumulka, and Nino Zanghì (2008). On the Common Structure of Bohmian Mechanics and the Ghirardi-Rimini-Weber Theory. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 59: 353-389.

Bell, John. S. (1987). Speakable and Unspeakable in Quantum Mechanics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Huggett, Nick and Wüthrich, Christian (2013). Emergent Spacetime and Empirical (In)coherence. Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics 44: 276-285.

Maudlin, Tim (2007). Completeness, Supervenience, and Ontology. Journal of Physics A: Mathematical and Theoretical 40: 3151-3171.