Divine Evil?: The Moral Character of the God of Abraham

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Michael Bergmann, Michael J. Murray, and Michael C. Rea (eds.), Divine Evil?: The Moral Character of the God of Abraham, Oxford University Press, 2011, 337pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199576739.

Reviewed by Charles Taliaferro, St. Olaf College


Divine Evil? is not your typical philosophy of religion text. It is more like reading a trial in which God is on the stand and accused of the worst conceivable crimes, from genocide and rape to lesser misdeeds like fornication (having sex with Eve). Fortunately for God, there are some able philosophers who function as defense attorneys, but there is some bitterness and polemics in the prose. All the papers came from a conference sponsored by the Center for Philosophy of Religion at the University of Notre Dame in September 2009. Maybe everyone was super friendly, but I have trouble picturing this when I read Louise Antony's response to a contribution by Nicholas Wolterstorff: "To which I reply: Whaddya mean 'we', white man?" (259).

In all, sixteen contributors to this book reflect on the portrait of God to be found in the Hebrew Bible/Christian Old Testament, with modest attention given to the Christian view of redemption. The introduction, authored by the three editors, offers a helpful overview of the challenge facing a practicing, reflective, morally sensitive Christian. The three Michaels (the editors) cite Deuteronomy 20:10-18 and Joshua 11:6, which appear to be divine commands sanctioning enslavement and merciless slaughter. The editors outline three possible maneuvers: (1) deny these and other ostensibly unjust commands are truly divine commands and deny that the texts are divinely inspired; (2) accept the texts as divinely inspired but propose a morally acceptable interpretation or message in the relevant scripture, or (3) offer a defense of the texts and commands as divinely inspired and unproblematic. The editors also commend future projects that are promising: further study of Ancient Near Eastern literary styles; further investigations into Ancient and Near Eastern cultures, and more work on interpretive traditions and the philosophy of biblical inspiration, divine revelation, and the authority of scripture and tradition.

There are three parts. In the first, "Philosophical Perspectives: Problems Presented," Louise Antony, Edwin Curly, and Evan Fales each argue that the God of the Bible is neither loving nor morally perfect. God is instead vain, cruel, commanding child sacrifice, genocidal, and so on. By their lights, the God of the Bible is a lying, murderous, sadistic, psychopathic, bad parent. Fales also takes aim at the psychological perniciousness of the Christian understanding of vicarious atonement.

Each of these contributors are matched with a critic or commentator and then given a chance to reply. Eleonore Stump challenges Antony's methodology, contending that her portrait of the loveless God of the Bible is unfounded and reflects a narrow interpretation of the Biblical texts. Antony then replies that if Stump is correct, there is still a problem for how the Bible can serve as a divine revelation. "And so I pose an additional final challenge," writes Antony, "why would God 'reveal' himself in so obscure a way that one needs a Ph.D. to understand him?" (56). Peter van Inwagen replies to Curley, contending that the Bible reflects the gradual human apprehension of God in a progressive evolution. Moreover, van Inwagen proposes that the ethical complaints about the God of the Bible often reflect the inheritance of the Judeo-Christian tradition, a thesis Curley rejects (89). Alvin Plantinga challenges Fales' interpretation and evaluation of Biblical texts and Christian views of the atonement. I suggest Plantinga rightly points to an assumption that runs through a number of the critiques of the God of the Bible. Critics often work with "considering God just one more specially talented human being, a sort of Ubermensch" (114). Perhaps the critics (who are mostly atheistic, but two may be agnostic) would reply that this is the point, namely, the God of the Bible is to be objected to, in part, because this God is only too human. Still, perhaps the further observation to make is that even if the God in the Bible has a human cast, the Bible may still serve as a means to relate to the morally perfect, transcendent Creator, a being who is no "specially talented human being," etc.

Part II, "Philosophical Perspectives: Solutions Proposed," consists of five main contributions with five rejoinders and then a reply to each rejoinder.

In Chapter Four, John Hare offers a sympathetic, interesting overview of animal sacrifice in the Hebrew Bible in light of the fact that animals were seen as part of Israelite households; that animals were involved in an evaluative transfer that honored the holiness of God; and that the sacrifices assisted the people of Israel to imitate God, follow divinely revealed precepts, and expiate sin. James Crenshaw charges that God's sanctioning animal sacrifice can in no way be considered good or fitting. In the instructive exchange with Hare, I learned that some accuse the God of Genesis of having had sex with Eve (based on Genesis 4:1). Fortunately for God, Hare rightly deflects that charge as ungrounded.

In "God Beyond Justice," Mark Murphy defends the God of the Bible by employing skeptical theism and the thesis that God is not on the same moral plane as we creatures. In "The Problem of Evil and the History of Peoples: Think Amalek" Eleonore Stump defends the texts in which Amalek is slain in light of her broad account of God permitting suffering in order to save us from a loveless turning away from God and life (a thesis developed with great skill in Stump's extraordinary work Wandering in Darkness). In "What Does the Old Testament Mean?" Richard Swinburne offers a brilliant account of the meaning of scripture in light of a comprehensive theology. Nicholas Wolterstorff offers a nuanced, defensible interpretation of the Book of Joshua. Their critics, Wes Morriston (who comments on Murphy and Swinburne), Paul Draper (who offers an insightful reply to Stump), and Louise Antony (who offers a sharp, unsympathetic reply to Wolterstorff) are unconvinced, however.

I register only one minor caveat on these exchanges. While Swinburne's contribution comes closest to my own position (in fact I do not think we disagree on any of the points he touches upon), still, I wished he had used a better analogy when he (in my view, quite rightly) made the following point:

God does not wrong the Canaanites … if he makes the gift of life shorter for some of them than for some other humans. If there is a God, he has made it abundantly clear that the 'gift' of life is a temporary one which he makes as long or short as he chooses. To use an analogy, I may lend you a book, saying, 'you can have this until I want it back'. I don't wrong you if I let other people use a book for a longer period than I let you use a book. (233-234)

Part III, "Theological Perspectives," includes two Biblical scholars, Gary Anderson and Christopher Seitz, with replies by two philosophers, Nicholas Wolterstorff and Evan Fales. In this section, one can see the difficulty (as well as the promise) of practicing philosophy and theology in light of historical texts. There is controversy over whether the children of Israel actually carried out the conquests narrated in the Bible (versus there being a peaceful migration) and then controversy over whether, if there had been a divinely sanctioned conquest, that would have been morally unproblematic. Added to this is this question: assuming there was no conquest, is it problematic to claim that the Biblical narrative of the conquest is divinely inspired?

Some concluding remarks are offered by Howard Wettstein under the title "God's Struggles". Wettstein concludes:

Religion, suggests William James, is in the end a matter of the gut rather than of the head. In this spirit, I want to suggest that religion's natural bedfellows are more the arts than the sciences. Religion, wrote Santayana, pursues wisdom through the imagination. It is productive not of a system of the world, a sort of super-physics or metaphysics, but of a way -- a literature and set of related practices -- to ennoble human life, to give meaning to and make meaning of our deepest hopes, fears, longings, and dreams. (331)

It is interesting that Wettstein does not think that religion is in the end a matter of philosophy, though perhaps that is part of Wettstein's philosophy of religion. I am also not sure one can set aside metaphysics (and epistemology and value theory) when addressing what makes human life noble, meaningful and coming to terms with our deep hopes, fears, longings, and dreams. In "A Speculative Appendix" Wettstein adds: "Better to suffer in confusion about God, an appropriate state for us if not a pleasurable one, than to forgo these stories" (333).

I am not sure how pleasurable these exchanges were for participants in the conference or how pleasurable readers will find these exchanges, but I believe the volume succeeds in making explicit the charges against the God of the Bible while also making available a variety of defenses by some of the most outstanding contributors to philosophy of religion today. I further believe the editors' suggestions for further work (mentioned earlier) are exactly the direction that the conversation should go. Fortunately, there has been such work already, and, as far as philosophy of revelation goes, I especially commend the work of William Abraham and Richard Swinburne. In different but compatible ways, they show how the meaning of scripture needs to be seen in light of an overall historical tradition. By their lights, the meaning of texts about (for example) the treatment of Canaanites rests on these texts being read in light of an overriding understanding of a God of love, justice, and mercy.

If you have an interest in the themes of Divine Evil?, I highly recommend Is God a Moral Monster? Making Sense of the Old Testament God by Paul Copan (Grand Rapids: Baker Books, 2011).