Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life

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Justin E. H. Smith, Divine Machines: Leibniz and the Sciences of Life, Princeton University Press, 2011, 392pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691141787.

Reviewed by Jeffrey K. McDonough, Harvard University


It is widely recognized that Leibniz's philosophical thought is deeply influenced by the mathematics, physics and philosophical theology of his era. Justin E. H. Smith's Divine Machines argues that many of Leibniz's most central philosophical doctrines are similarly bound up with the life sciences of his time, where the "life sciences" are understood very broadly to include fields as diverse as alchemy, medicine, taxonomy, and paleontology. Smith's groundbreaking exploration represents an important contribution to our understanding of both Leibniz's philosophy and the study of life in the early modern era. It is to be recommended to historians, philosophers, and historians of philosophy alike. Below I highlight four central topics in Smith's book, raising some reservations along the way.

1. First Things

The first part of Divine Machines is divided into two chapters, the first of which explores Leibniz's views on medicine. As Smith shows in detail, Leibniz, like many of his early modern contemporaries, was deeply interested in the study of medicine and its ancillary fields. Thus in a letter of 1697, Leibniz declares medicine to be "the most necessary of the natural sciences" and maintains that it is "the principal fruit of our knowledge of bodies," since the promotion of health may allow us to "work for the glory of God" (26). This lofty aim no doubt bolstered Leibniz's interest in (what we would call) chemistry and anatomy (28-33, 48-58). In connection with the former, Smith provides a rather detailed account of Leibniz's treatise on the "purgative power" of the ipecacuanha root, a treatise that Smith calls, with (I assume) unintentionally faint praise, "the most comprehensive and influential of Leibniz's contributions to the history of medicine and pharmacy" (40). In connection with anatomy, Smith chronicles what he sees as a shift in Leibniz's enthusiasms away from vivisection towards microscopy.

That Leibniz should be interested in medicine and laud its practical benefits is hardly surprising. More surprising is Smith's suggestion that Leibniz's famous doctrine of pre-established harmony "is ultimately rooted in . . . [a] perceived parallelism between medicine and theology" (26). Smith notes that in an early text aimed at reforming the medical profession, Leibniz "repeatedly draws a parallel between the way the clergy is organized and the way doctors should, ideally, be organized" (36). Leibniz suggests, for example, that doctors, like the clergy, should be organized into orders, make themselves readily available in big cities, and be concerned not only with curing ills but also with preventing them. All sensible suggestions to be sure, but a thin basis for supposing that Leibniz sees "medicine as care of the body and religion as care of the soul," as "but two sides of the same coin;" and an even thinner basis for seeing Leibniz's proposed reforms of the organization of the medical profession as paving the way for his radical metaphysical thesis that the mind and body do not causally interact but rather unfold according to independent, synchronized laws.

The second chapter explores Leibniz's interests in "animal economy," understood as "the study of the animal body as a particular kind of machine, with an eye to the way in which the organs of the animal machine are coordinated with one another for the execution of that machine's intrinsic ends" (19). As Smith explains, for Leibniz the body of an animal is essentially a complex machine capable of taking in nourishment and converting it into motion. The animal body is also able to pass on its own likeness to other machines, thus contributing to the survival of its species. In virtue of these two capacities, Leibniz suggests that there is a sense in which animal bodies may be viewed as perpetual motion machines. Although Leibniz's views on animal economy fit well with the mechanism popular in his time, he nonetheless disagreed with influential contemporaries on important points of detail. In insisting that animal machines enjoy intrinsic ends worthy of careful investigation, Leibniz draws a sharp distinction between his own views and those of Descartes (while simultaneously aligning himself more closely with the likes of Galen, Harvey and Boyle). In maintaining that the soul plays no role in preserving the structure of the animal machine, Leibniz distinguishes his own position from that of G. E. Stahl, whose rival view he mocks as making the function of the soul similar to that of salts used in preserving hams (89).

2. From Animal Economy to Subtle Anatomy

The second part of Divine Machines tracks what Smith sees as a general transition in Leibniz's interests from "animal economy" to "subtle anatomy" (93). The third chapter highlights the central commitment of Leibniz's position on subtle anatomy, namely, that every organic body is composed of infinitely many other organic bodies, and therefore must itself be infinitely complex. As Smith emphasizes, an organic machine is thus a special kind of machine not because it defies mechanism, but rather because it is ordered or organized in an organic way. Leibniz is therefore able to distinguish between organic and inorganic bodies without invoking particular, immaterial, vital principles such as those defended by the Cambridge Platonist Ralph Cudworth. Even though he allows that every organic body is paired with an immaterial nature, Leibniz consistently maintains that every (non-miraculous) change in an organic body can be accounted for in terms of mechanistic causes alone.

The fourth chapter aims to shed further light on Leibniz's model of organic bodies by looking to "the empirical life sciences of his era, especially to the seventeenth century's discovery of the ubiquity of subvisible living creatures as well as its growing awareness of the deep interdependence of all living entities" (137). It is well known that Leibniz saw the discovery of microscopic organisms as lending support to his philosophical views concerning corporeal substances. In the course of filling out this important scientific context, Smith helpfully clarifies when Leibniz would have been exposed to some especially relevant discoveries. Although it has been suggested that Leibniz could not have been inspired by empirical research into the micro-world prior to his earliest philosophical writings, Smith points out that reports of "minute invisible insects" reach back as far as 1647, and had already attracted widespread attention from natural philosophers well before Leibniz's writings in the mid-1660's. Smith also notes an interesting shift that may have helped to clear the way for Leibniz's model of harmoniously nested individuals. In pre-modern eras, the presence of one organism within another organism was considered to be cause for alarm. Parasites were generally viewed as being extraordinary and harmful. Discoveries with microscopes, however, suggested that the presence of one organism within another organism might be common, and even more importantly, innocuous. One can see how that realization might have eased the way for Leibniz's model of harmoniously nested organisms, although one suspects that the study of organs must have played at least an equally important role in driving Leibniz's vision of not just innocuous, but symbiotically nested organic entities.

An intriguing question that figures centrally in both of Smith's chapters on subtle economy is to what extent Leibniz's theory of corporeal substances was in fact motivated by discoveries in the life sciences. As one might have expected, Smith finds it plausible to suppose, in particular, that "the world-within-worlds doctrine, or the model of nested individuality, was inspired by microscopy from the very beginning" (152). In spite of the historical case he carefully constructs, however, there seems to be good reasons to be cautious here. First, there is a striking passage, dutifully cited by Smith, in which Leibniz explicitly insists that one could have anticipated the existence of microscopic animals prior to their empirical discovery just "as Democritus foresaw the imperceptible stars in the Milky Way before the discovery of the telescope" (150). Second, Leibniz offers clear lines of argument for the postulation of infinitely nested organic unities that do not rely on the life sciences at all. So, for example, drawing on rational mechanics, he argues that motion in a plenum requires that matter be everywhere infinitely divided into parts. Drawing on a priori metaphysical principles, he argues that every part of matter must be exhaustively constituted by organic unities. The conclusion that every part of matter must contain infinitely many organic unities follows straightaway without the need of any premises drawn from the life sciences. Third, and perhaps most importantly, Leibniz's claims concerning the infinite nesting of organic individuals goes far beyond anything that could have been supported by the life sciences of his time. Microscopes could reveal tiny creatures living in unexpected places, but they could never show that every living creature is exhaustively composed of infinitely many tinier living creatures. It is therefore perhaps more charitable to see Leibniz as taking the microscopic discoveries of his day as lending an important additional line of support to his worlds-within-worlds doctrine, rather than as being its principal inspiration.

3. The Origins of Organic Form

The third part of Divine Machines considers Leibniz's views on plant and animal generation. The fifth chapter takes up more specifically Leibniz's well-known doctrine according to which all living creatures are created and destroyed solely by God alone. Familiar cases of reproduction and death are, according to Leibniz, actually instances of rapid "augmenting" or "diminishing" -- plants and animals may blossom and shrink, as it were, but they are never truly generated nor annihilated in the order of nature. Although it seems to controvert our most fundamental experiences as living beings, Leibniz is able to marshal a surprisingly wide-range of considerations in support of his remarkable view. It agrees nicely, for example, with his theses of infinite nesting and pre-established harmony, as well as with his somewhat idiosyncratic views on creaturely immortality. As Smith emphasizes in detail, however, Leibniz could also see his views on generation and corruption as dovetailing with then recent innovations in the life sciences. In Jan Swammerdam's work on insect metamorphosis, Leibniz could find a measure of empirical support for his conjecture that cases of apparent genesis are actually instances of the sudden flourishing of an already present organic creature (189). Similarly, in the work of Antoni van Leeuwenhoek, Leibniz could see empirical confirmation of the diminished creatures postulated by his theory of generation and corruption (176).

The sixth chapter focuses on "three distinct cases of natural generativity: (i) the influence of the maternal imagination in fetal development, (ii) spontaneous generation, and (iii) the origins of paleontological forms" (200). In the first case, Smith argues that while Leibniz showed a continued interest in the theory that a mother's imagination might influence the development of her offspring, that theory plays a relatively minor role in his thought "for the deep reason that it is incompatible with his doctrine of pre-established harmony" (200). In the second case, Smith argues that theories of spontaneous generation underwent important changes in the early modern period. Whereas earlier thinkers were inclined to see spontaneous generation as involving cosmic influences on mundane matter, Leibniz, like many later thinkers, was more inclined to the view that apparently spontaneously generated organisms were in fact emergent by-products of decay and other natural causes (211-212). In the third case, Smith argues that Leibniz came to reject the view that fossils are mere "games of nature," maintaining instead -- and, again, in agreement with many of his contemporaries -- that they are most likely the remains of once living creatures.

Smith's discussion in Part Three brings to the surface an issue that drums in the background of other parts of Divine Machines as well. An overarching ambition of Smith's project is to show how the details of the early modern life sciences may be used to illuminate the enduring themes of Leibniz's philosophical thought. In many cases Smith is clearly successful in doing just that. There's no doubt, for example, that Leibniz was significantly influenced by the work of early microbiologists such as Swammerdam and Leeuwenhoek, and Smith's discussion of these figures helpfully fills out the historical context of Leibniz's thinking about generation and pre-formation. The connection between Leibniz's doctrine of pre-established harmony and early modern theories of maternal imagination, however, may serve as an example of a connection that seems far less revealing. Leibniz's doctrine gives him a reason to reject the maternal imagination theory only in the uninteresting sense that it gives him a reason to deny that any created substance may exercise a genuine causal influence on any other created substance. Consistent with his doctrine, Leibniz could have allowed that a mother's imagination might influence the development of her offspring in the same sense in which he allows that the movement of one billiard ball may (quasi-)cause the movement of another billiard ball. The doctrine of pre-established harmony is thus in a sense too deep a reason for Leibniz to reject the maternal imagination theory, and the attempt to relate these two particular threads in Leibniz's thinking seems to shed little light on either one. While it feels almost ungrateful to complain about there being, at times, too much historical detail in Divine Machines, it is no small part of the intellectual historian's task to decide which historical facts are truly significant and which are just distracting curiosities.

4. Species

The fourth part of Divine Machines consists of a single chapter devoted to Leibniz's views on biological species. Perhaps the most philosophically important thesis held by Leibniz in this regard is that there is a non-arbitrary, non-pragmatic division of animals into species. But what is the basis of this "natural" sorting? Smith's discussion suggests two rather different accounts. First, animals might be sorted into species on the basis of their respective functions. Thus, Smith tells us that "For Leibniz the animal is not just a machine of perpetual self-nutrition and self-reproduction . . . It also has its own 'special office' (officium) that makes it a member of the species to which it belongs." Borrowing an example from Leibniz, Smith adds "It is of the essence of a squirrel to dance or jump, so a squirrel is, essentially, a dancing or jumping machine" (248). Second, animals might be sorted into species on the basis of lines of descent so that, for example, something is a squirrel if and only if its parents are squirrels. In this vein, Smith tells us that "Leibniz believes that species membership is rooted in descent, or, in other words, that the kind of creature a creature is, is determined exhaustively by the kind of creatures its parents were," adding a couple pages later that "Species membership is an all or nothing affair determined by descent from the same parents" (256, 258).

Most likely Leibniz saw these two accounts as being extensionally equivalent. That is to say, he probably thought that, at least in general, all squirrels, for example, are both dancing machines and descendants of other squirrels. But it's hard to believe that he thought that they are necessarily coextensive. What would he say then if, for example, a dancing machine were to give birth to a swimming machine or a swimming machine to a dancing machine? Leibniz's views on pre-formation and abnormal humans would seem to speak strongly in favor of the function account at the expense of the descent account. Given that all creatures, for Leibniz, are created directly by God, it's hard to see how natural descent could be essential to any creature, and Leibniz's willingness to count abnormal human offspring as nonetheless belonging to the human species hinges importantly upon their having the essential capacity of reason (rather than their simply having human parents). Leibniz's eagerness to acknowledge radical morphological variation and even evolving adaptations, however, gives him reason to put weight on descent at the expense of essential functions. By emphasizing common ancestry, Leibniz can more easily allow that two animals might belong to the same species in spite of their enjoying very different central capacities. Smith makes some suggestive remarks about how these two seemingly rival accounts might be brought together by Leibniz (see especially, 250) but what exactly Leibniz takes to be the deepest grounds of species membership and why is one of the many topics raised by Smith's stimulating Divine Machines that remains ripe for further investigation. One hopes that others will follow Smith's able lead in pursuing such topics, and, more generally, in the task of reimagining Leibniz as a philosopher deeply embroiled in the life sciences of his time.