Divine Powers in Late Antiquity

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Anna Marmodoro and Irini-Fotini Viltanioti, Divine Powers in Late Antiquity, Oxford University Press, 2017, 288pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198767206.

Reviewed by Michael Griffin, University of British Columbia


This collection explores how ancient Mediterranean philosophers, writing in Greek and Latin between about the first and fifth centuries CE, "conceptualize the idea that the divine is powerful" (1). These philosophers offered sophisticated accounts of divine powers or potentials (dunameis) -- roughly, instances of properties that enable their owners to effect or undergo a change. The leading protagonists are (in chronological sequence), Philo of Alexandria, Paul of Tarsus (and other composers and interpreters of early Christian texts), Plotinus, Origen, Porphyry, Iamblichus, Basil of Caesarea, Gregory of Nyssa, and Proclus. These twelve contributions -- originating from a core of papers presented in a 2013 conference -- bridge boundaries between authors whom we sometimes distinguish as Pagan, Christian, or Jewish, and mingle texts that scholars often set apart under the generic headings of "philosophy" (like Plotinus' Enneads) or "theology" (like the Gospels).

Anna Marmodoro and Irini-Fotini Viltanioti's introduction explains the volume's criteria for success (1-2) and define its central concept: "in very general terms, powers are instances of physical properties that enable their possessors to bring about or suffer change, when the conditions are appropriate" (2). The survey that follows should be useful both for metaphysicians unfamiliar with the classical material, and ancient philosophers and classicists unfamiliar with contemporary analytic metaphysics. The editors effectively draw out the threads that bind the chapters (9-13), and the contributors capitalize on several of these opportunities.

Kevin Corrigan's contribution on Plotinus begins Part I, a series of six essays on the pagan "Neoplatonists" -- a category that Corrigan recognizes as anachronistic (18). For Plotinus, following Plato, dunamis is a fundamental principle (20, 26). Plotinus' system centres on three hypostases: the One, Intellect, and Soul (18-23). After discussing the power of the One and its return through Intellect and Soul (23), Corrigan stresses that the One should not be "over-determined" or reified into some "it" or "this" (26); it is a "traveling subject" that "articulates itself into Intellect," which is the "power of everything" (31). The real source of human agency is the One, again not regarded as a "thing," but as a kind of subjectivity: "We trace freedom in action not to the outer activity . . . but to the inner activity" (34-35). Corrigan concludes that "power is the source and root from which intelligible activity springs" (35), unfolded into action as "the self-articulating or travelling subject, a subject that wakes up to itself" (36).

Pauliina Remes continues with a rich discussion of Plotinus' action theory. Action is divided into two kinds, one determinate (arising from direct relation to the good), and one indeterminate (39). Remes looks at how Plotinus situates actions in the natural order of things (42-43). Action is a "shadow of contemplation" (Enn. 3.8.4) in two senses. Every action is caused by an intelligible principle, but only some actions also aim for an intelligible principle. Those that do not are a "weakening" of contemplation; those that do are a "consequence" of it (50). Remes considers several challenges: for instance, would this view imply that only a trained philosopher can act virtuously (55)? No, though only actions that "consciously attempt to realize something of the intelligible order" count as genuine consequences. Actions, under material-temporal constraints, are never as free as the contemplation that they image: but those constraints can be mitigated by having one's focus "firmly governed by knowledge of the intelligible principles and of the Good" (59-60).

Viltanioti shifts the focus to Plotinus' pupil, Porphyry, and his theory of divine powers in the treatise "On Statues" (Peri agalmatōn), an allegory of the iconography of Greek and Egyptian gods. "Behind every god" in the treatise, "Porphyry sees a power" (64). For example, "the power of Cronos" is "the power of time" -- either because the power is a property of the god, or because the god is this power (64-65). With the exception of Zeus, all the powers discussed belong within the physical realm. Viltanioti builds on Andrew Smith's study of "double power" (68). Porphyry's aim in the treatise "was to instruct novice philosophers on the way in which proper contemplation of the images of the gods could serve in obtaining unification of power and thus elevation of the soul towards Intellect and the One" (71). A helpful appendix summarizes gods and divine powers in the Peri agalamatōn.

Peter T. Struck's lively chapter on Iamblichus' theory of divination in De mysteriis is a natural companion to the prequel. Struck briefly summaries the Platonic, Aristotelian, and Stoic background that Iamblichus follows (76-77), and identifies a theme: "divinatory insight is a kind of epiphenomenon of physiology, manifesting some kind of a divine hand." Emphasizing the embodied aspect of Iamblichus' theory (78), Struck compares Viltanioti's chapter on Porphyry. Strikingly, Struck proposes that a category of merely human (not divine) intuition -- epibolē and epaphē -- was first carved out by Iamblichus (86): if this is right, Iamblichus might be partly responsible for the modern commonplace notion of "intuition". True divination is not explained by any material or human powers, but as a divine gift (80-87).

Todd Krulak's contribution continues the theme of statue animation, now focusing on Proclus' commentary on Plato's Timaeus. For Proclus, practice with an agalma or sacred statue may be less successful (92): why? Is it a "deficiency" in the ritual, or the statue's degree of fitness (93)? We turn to a helpful ontological summary of the gods, who are present and active at many levels (95-98), and an overview of Proclus' theory of powers and acts (94-98). Powers strive to reconstitute the aspects of the unitary Demiurge (97), while acts are effortless works of beings who create simply by existing (98). In a fully successful rite, the animated statue interacts with higher productive acts (poiēseis) of the god, from the first term of its descending series; in a moderately successful rite, perhaps limited by the fitness of the image to receive the god, the god's lesser powers (dunameis) are participated (103). Krulak offers a fascinating speculation on how Proclus might have distinguished these kinds of cases phenomenologically (103-6), and reminds the reader that Proclus' point is consistently soteriological: the soul's purification and liberation (107).

Marco Antonio Santamaría Álvarez concludes Part I with the Orphic Rhapsodies, which -- alongside the Chaldaean Oracles -- comprised an inspired scriptural core for later Neoplatonists. The chapter begins with orienting context from Hesiod's Theogony (108-11), and offers a valuable reconstruction and synopsis of the entire Orphic cosmogony, structured around the transmission of divine power between "six kings of the gods" -- Phanes, Night, Uranus, Cronus, Zeus, and Dionysus (113-19). The apparent violence of the transmission of divine power in Hesiod is moderated in the Orphic Derveni papyrus, still further in the Orphic Rhapsodies (123); the sceptre is an important symbol, representing "pacific transmission of divine power" (119-20). As the Orphics' lifestyle of purity sought to cancel the "ancient crime" of the Titans who dismembered Dionysus, perhaps they also sought to return to Dionysus his sceptre (124).

Baudouin S. Decharneux helps to link Parts I and II through the figure of Philo of Alexandria and his treatise On the creation of the world -- which offers an allegory of Genesis in terms of a monotheistic reading of Plato's Timaeus. How do biblical and Platonic ideas interact? Decharneux's view is that Philo balances them (127): in general, "if the Torah is the axiomatic starting point . . . Platonism is the tool for its correct understanding . . . both biblical ideas and Platonic philosophy are necessary for this ascent" (139). Powers facilitate God's presence in the sensible world, as well as the sensible world's participation in the intelligible (128); the intelligible world itself is "nothing else than the Logos of God when he was already engaged in the act of creation" (133). God has powers as maker and father, and as both active and passive causes (128-30). Created entities receive the Good according to their own powers (132), which diminish with each passing generation, like Plato's magnet empowering sequential rings of iron (136). Human beings must acknowledge God's powers, and in this way it is possible to regain our initial place near God.

Jonathan Hill's contribution on dunamis in early Christianity presents a meticulously sourced and detailed argument for "a distinctively Christian understanding of divine power in the early centuries of the Church . . . driven primarily by concerns about apostolic mission and preaching" (140). Two keynote themes run through the chapter: God's dunamis extends in some way to Christians and is manifest in their lives and salvation; and God's dunamis is not only an object of awe and terror, but is also in some way revealed in weakness. Broadly, Hill identifies five aspects of dunamis in Paul (146), and two more in Ignatius: (1) Christological; (2) Communicative; (3) Pneumatological; (4) Kerygmatic; (5) Pre-eminence; (6) Prophetic; (7) Ethical.

Hill begins with a brief overview of the role of power in the Septuagint, stressing that divine and human powers there remain separate, and noting that the authors of the Septuagint tend to resort to iskhus rather than dunamis for talk of power (141). (This is one point where it might be interesting to open a dialogue with the earlier contribution on Philo).

The next section studies Pauline Christianity (141-47), setting out from Richard Kearney's thesis that for Paul, dunamis means possibility rather than power. God acts through dunamis, and empowers Christians (142): in fact Christ just is the dunamis of God (143). Paul's association of divine power with weakness is revolutionary (144-5) and profoundly influential.

Hill moves on to the Synoptic Gospels and Acts. In Mark and Matthew, Jesus' dunamis could just be that of a miracle-working man (148), while in Luke the dunamis of Jesus is that of God. Paul's notion of dunamis as weakness is barely visible here, if at all (149). The next section treats Ignatius of Antioch, who also associates divine dunamis with Christ (150). The penultimate section focuses on the Shepherd of Hermas, who perhaps emphasizes the "pre-eminence" concept that only God's dunamis is real, and introduces -- on Hill's view -- two additional notions: (7) the "Prophetic" aspect, and (8) an "ethical" concept of dunamis.

The final section treats Justin Martyr (156), and attributes to him multiple notions of dunamis, including the Christological, pneumatological, communication, and weakness concepts, with a subtle distinction from Paul on this latter point: "where Paul sees the divine power acting in times of weakness and suffering, Justin sees the divine power as acting in the weakness itself" (161).

Mark Edwards examines early Christian texts from a different vantage point. He structures his essay around a definite objective: to show that the early Christians could have worked straightforwardly from Scripture, and that scholars often overestimate the influence of Greek philosophy upon them (163). Edwards offers a table of uses of dunamis in early Christian authors, which differs from but also overlaps with Hill's (163-65). (Since Edwards and Hill carve the joints a little differently, this is also a spot where it might be interesting to cultivate further conversation between contributions). Following Edwards, there are roughly seven key categories: (1) The power of God; (2) God himself; (3) Mighty works; (4) The power of the exalted Christ; (5) The power entrusted to believers; (6) Christ himself; (7) Delegated power. Edwards employs these categories to great effect in examining Justin (165) and other apologists (168-69), then continues with Clement, Origen, and Athanasius. Clement views Christ as the dunamis of God, and focuses especially on the capacity of the Logos to illumine us. Origen marks a shift toward the edification of the faithful (170). Edwards emphasizes that "even Origen continues to be ruled by scriptural precedent" (172), with few exceptions. Athanasius, in turn, emphasizes the utterly unique dunamis of God. Edwards concludes with a strong defense of working from sola scriptura in analyzing these authors (176).

Ilaria L. E. Ramelli explores the topic of divine power in Origen and his "sources and aftermath": in fact, her chapter encompasses Bardaisan, Origen, Gregory of Nyssa, and numerous Middle Platonists and Neoplatonists. Ramelli picks up her earlier arguments for the similarity of Origen and Bardaisan (178-79). For Origen, perhaps following Bardaisan, Dunamis is an epinoia of Christ, alongside Logos and Sophia (182). God's power is Christ, made especially clear in the Cross (184); through this power, the ultimate outcome of all things is that badness will be eliminated and all souls will be brought to completion (185). Following Paul, Origen has a concept of God's power as manifest in human weakness (185-86). Gregory of Nyssa also treats the Cross as symbolic for how all realities and extremes are "governed and kept together by the One" (186); God's salvific power extends everywhere and supports everything (187-88). For Gregory as for Origen, the Logos is a transcendent unity, one as all, and all as one (188). Ramelli teases out numerous possible resonances with other figures, including Atticus, Ammonius, and Pantaenus (191-3) and later Plotinus (197-98), and emphasizes the "apophatic" view that God's nature and power are beyond being and knowing (194-95), yet can be recognized through God's activities (197). She offers an excellent comparison of Origen and Gregory's power-theology with Plotinus' view that a soul can, without descending, vivify the body by its dunameis; this is just how divinity operates in the world (197-98); this view has Peripatetic roots. But Gregory "insists more on the dunamis of God"; the greatest manifestation of God's power is in the resurrection and ultimate apokatastasis (198).

Andrew Radde-Gallwitz offers a clear, engaging study of Basil of Caesarea's homily on the six days of creation, stressing Basil's unusually literal reading of Genesis as natural philosophy (199). Basil has philosophical resources (200) to respond to a style of objection to Genesis associated with Galen (201). On Basil's view, the elements naturally and necessarily cohere due to their properties and powers, in turn due to God (205). Basil uses powers to solve exegetical puzzles: water did not flow before God's command because it did not yet have that power (209). In general, "events depend on the properties and powers of things, which are themselves dependent on God's commands" (217).

Marmodoro's chapter on Gregory of Nyssa, reprinted from Causation and Creation in Late Antiquity (2015), tackles a philosophical puzzle: given his commitment to the principle that "like causes like", how can Gregory maintain that an immaterial God created a material world (218)? Is Gregory an early idealist, denying that the world is material (219)? Marmodoro examines this "eliminativist" solution in various forms (220-22), but ultimately rejects it, chiefly on the grounds of limited textual evidence. She examines a "non-eliminativist" alternative according to which material objects are combinations of conceptual qualities (223); but this view, she argues, just shifts the burden of explanation. (How are these conceptual entities supposed to cause non-conceptual bodies?) Rather, "in creating the natural qualities, God thereby created all that was needed for the constitution of material bodies" (223). More specifically, (1) God created immaterial qualities (which are intelligible, because they are definable) (224); (2) material bodies are bundles of these immaterial qualities. Marmodoro explores the implications of this solution in detail (225-32), and argues that Gregory could make more use of Aristotelian metaphysical tools to fill out his account (233).

Does this volume realize its own dunamis? While several essays struck me as especially innovative, every contribution shed light on the current state of play in scholarship in late antique philosophy, and together they present a valuable snapshot of the field for experts and newcomers alike. The narrative is clear and the text as a whole is well-presented.[1] The central question is whether a concept as multivalent as dunamis provides a sufficient "trait d'union" to connect a tale of this diversity (2). The answer, I think, is yes, with a gentle qualification. Here's the yes: the volume clearly shows that these philosophers speak of divine dunamis in a usefully comparable way, and that it's exegetically valuable to read them in dialogue. And here's the qualification: any collection of this breadth can only begin to draw out the potential for dialogue implied by the plentiful cross-references between chapters. And that's the very point of this book: Marmodoro and Viltanioti are to be thanked for an excellent collection that clearly demonstrates the promise of continued research on dunamis across disciplinary boundaries.

[1] I found very few slips of the pen (for instance, 7, "stoics" not capitalized; 7 n. 24 duplicates the text; 13 "acknowledgements" seem out of place; 31 dynamis misprinted; 37 "Republic 6 7"), none significant to the sense.