Divine Teaching and the Way of the World: A Defense of Revealed Religion

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Samuel Fleischacker, Divine Teaching and the Way of the World: A Defense of Revealed Religion, Oxford University Press, 2011, 559pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199217366.

Reviewed by Jerome Gellman, Ben Gurion University of the Negev


In this ambitious volume, Fleischacker provides an intricate and sophisticated argument for rationally justifying one's taking a religious text as divine revelation. The argument is rich in creative thinking and in its breadth, and just might have succeeded were it not for the failure of the author's test-case, namely, his justification for his believing in the revelatory nature of the Torah, and for several ill-supported defenses of religions and religious texts in general.

In Fleischacker's title, the "way of the world" is his translation of the Hebrew "derech eretz," and his motto for the book is "Beautiful is the study of Torah with derech eretz," taken from the Mishnah. In this book, the "way of the world" is made to refer to "secular" (i.e., not informed by religious doctrine) morality and science. One of Fleischacker's main theses is that these must be in place before a commitment to a text as revelatory. Fleischacker argues from an analysis of the state of nature and the socialized nature of truth that religious folk are duty-bound to the Way of the World. They must, that is, come to religion already equipped with entrenched secular morality and science. (The morality to be assumed is the overlap of the various theories of morality, each of which Fleischacker carefully examines in Chapter Two for its strength and weaknesses.) Religion cannot make claims against either.

Next, Fleischacker argues that religion provides something that secularism fails to offer successfully -- what he calls "ethics," a telos for the moral life, that which makes living the moral life and life itself meaningful and worthwhile. Fleischacker presents an extended set of convincing arguments for the very legitimacy of seeking a life-telos and "meaning" in life. Then he charges secularism with an inability to provide a persuasive resolution of that seeking. He rejects as an adequate telos for life knowledge, pleasure, self-flourishing, projectivism (that we ourselves bestow value on our life), and Kantian accounts of worth. In any case, he argues, secular views about the meaningfulness of life have no more justification than do religious views (religious views, though, have the advantage of acknowledging that they are held in faith (p. 267)). Fleischacker comes to the following strong conclusion: "If we must accept a secular approach to worth, we will have no reason to think that any life -- religious or secular -- is worth living, while on religious accounts, some, many, or even all human lives will be worth living." (p. 168)

Telic beliefs are not a matter for scientific investigation or moral assessment. Thus Fleischacker has a free field with ethics without fear of being vetoed by science and morality. Specifically, we are to rationally justify adopting a religious text as a revelation on telic grounds alone, science and morality assumed already in place. To Fleischacker, one is impressed by the telos of a text by features such as its fascination and beauty, by its demanding the highest ideals of morality, indeed by its going further than morality demands and by its providing a "path," a sound set of practices for the implementation of its values. (pp. 280ff.) A revelatory text will emphasize moral values beyond what standard morality does, for example, increased concern for widows and orphans. A revelatory text provides telic direction with the category of the "holy," demanding personal transformation and not only prescribed actions.

To say a revelation is "true" for Fleischacker, therefore, is not to refer to its historical reliability or its sound moral teachings. (p. 67) Rather, it is to express trust in one's telic expectations of it. The text satisfies one's "telic yearnings." (p. 308) When a text strikes a person as revelatory, he then has reason to believe in God, for belief in God as the source of the revelation can give the best metaphysical account of the telic truth existing in the text (not, as we will see below, as an explanation for the existence of the text). (pp. 65ff., 270)

Here, Fleischacker has brought to our attention an important mode of justification, that of making sense of telic convictions, generally ignored in discussions of epistemic justification. When we have compelling empirical experiences we might not have an explanation for their occurrence. The situation might demand positing entities for that explanation. Thus can empirical experiences form the basis, and properly so, for scientific theorizing and metaphysical ontologizing. Just so, we could have an attitude toward the world and toward ourselves that was no less compelling, or maybe even more compelling, than a sense experience. By analogy to compelling empirical experiences, the natural question to pose would be: What would have to be the case for this attitude to be correct, that is, for it to be appropriate to reality? Positing a metaphysical ontology in reply could be as well based as ontologizing for empirical experiences. An attitude or value can be so basic, so pervasive, and so convincing that it demands a correlative ontology to adequately account for it. Fleischacker concludes that it is rationally justified to believe in God as a metaphysical account of the telic truth existing in the text.

Next, Fleischacker turns to his test-case defense of a belief in a text as a revelation, his personal belief in the Torah as a revelatory text. Why does he believe the Torah is the word of God? Because it satisfies his "telic yearnings," the story "rings true" to him ethically. Since the morality of a text must precede judging it a revelation, Fleischacker knows he must contend with what he calls the Torah's moral "pockmarks," Torah passages he deems morally reprehensible. He notes such passages as the Temple ritual of the accused wife, the command to destroy the people of Amalek, and the command to kill a rebellious son, what he calls a "notorious text." Since moral soundness is a prerequisite of faith in a text as revelatory, Fleischacker must defend his having faith in a Torah that contains such passages.

Here, Fleischacker provides the most intriguing argument in the book. (pp. 327ff.) The moral pockmarks, he says, are an advantage to a revealed text. The moral pockmarks in the Torah protect a Jew from the haughtiness of believing that with the Torah he possesses absolute, perfect truth. Instead, the Jew learns religious humility and tolerance of others. Indeed, the presence of pockmarks calls the Jew to moral and religious responsibility in the task of reinterpretation and furthering progress in the religious life. Fleischacker continues with the charge that Christian belief in the moral perfection of the New Testament, sans pockmarks, worked to the great detriment of Christianity. This belief led to an intolerance stemming from the belief that Christians alone possessed absolute religious truth. This created an aggressive defense and enforcement of that truth against those who would deny or doubt it. This belief has been responsible for the currents of literalism and fundamentalism within Christianity. Hence, our author concludes, it is good for a revelatory text to include some morally reprehensible material, to protect believers from the evils of religious domination and intolerance and from slavish literal fixation on the text.

There follows an extended discussion in which Fleischacker considers morally objectionable Torah passages, guided by the dictum that if a passage is clearly against standard morality it cannot be plainly understood. You must reinterpret it to bring it into line. Fleischacker focuses especially on systematic problems in Torah legislation, and most especially on what he judges to be sexist, xenophobic, or vengeful passages. His solution is to undertake a reinterpretation of all such passages to bring them into line with secular morality: "If Maimonides can find a non-anthropomorphic God in the Torah, we should have no trouble finding a non-sexist God there as well." (p. 385) Here Fleischacker refers to Maimonides' extended argument against an anthropomorphic God in The Guide for the Perplexed. Fleischacker believes that Maimonides' cleansing of anthropomorphism from the Torah was far more difficult than would be cleansing the Torah from what he takes to be sexist, as well as xenophobic and vengeful passages.

It is hard to square this discussion of the Torah with Fleischacker's previous requirement that a revelatory text must be morally sound. Any moral flaw should subtract from revelatory credentials. For Fleischacker, systematic moral failure should count strongly against a text being a revelation. The great number of Torah passages at odds with contemporary Western morality defies his talk about moral "pockmarks." To a contemporary Western, secular moralist it is more like bomb craters spread throughout the text. Just reinterpreting the worrisome passages relating to women would render the Torah barely recognizable from its present form and meaning. Contra Fleischacker, it would be very much more difficult a task than Maimonides had interpreting God non-anthropomorphically. In Judaism, "God" has been largely a placeholder, fillable by varying concepts as long as they preserve Jewish Law and a Jewish way of life. That's why Maimonides' campaign against anthropomorphism could succeed in the end. The passages we are discussing here, however, are too widespread and the reinterpretations would be too far-reaching for it to remain plausible to say that the Torah had passed the morality test before being accepted as a revelation. In addition, the extensive reinterpretations Fleischacker envisions would cause massive changes in Jewish Law (for example, the nature of Jewish marriage) and thus in the "path" that Fleischacker is supposed to have identified at the start as worthy of his telic expectations. Add to that the passages problematic in other ways to secular morality and we have a worrisome situation for Fleischacker's test case of the Torah as a revelatory text.

A more plausible position would have been for Fleischacker to maintain that one could become convinced of the revelatory character of a text independent of, or even in spite of, morally unacceptable passages. There could be attributes of a text so overwhelmingly impressive that a person would conclude that the text could not possibly have been created by a human being, even granting its morally problematic content. That conviction then would motivate dealing with the morally unacceptable in a satisfactory way. The possibilities of doing so would be many. These would include reinterpretation of texts, and saying that originally the morally objectionable passages were not part of the revelatory text but later tack-ons or simply reflected human misunderstandings. One could also invoke the notion of divine concession, as Maimonides does at times, to reason that at the time of its formulation the recipients of the revelation were not morally ready for our contemporary moral sensibilities. Fleischacker calls it a "child's view" to accept a text as revelation on the grounds that it could not have been authored by a human being. (p. 302) He goes on to reason as follows:

If a text or speech really was such that no human being could possibly have composed it, no human being would be able to understand it either (or, therefore, recognize its truth). If we are capable of understanding something, then we are also capable of composing it, because if a human could not have authored it then neither could a human understand it. (p. 302)

Why should this be so? The universe could not have been created by humans, yet we do manage to understand much about it. Computers solve mathematical problems that humans cannot solve. Yet, humans manage to understand the results. That a text could not have originated with humans does not entail that we cannot understand it. Furthermore, at most what would follow is that humans could not understand the text with their unaided minds. God, or a Holy Spirit, though, might grant them a super-human understanding of the text in an act of Grace. It would then be the case both that the text could not have been created by a human being and that we understand it.

The underestimation of the problems he faces regarding contemporary morality and the Torah is of a piece with Fleischacker's questionable pronouncements favorable to religion and to Judaism. Here is a sampling. "When asked why they consider their text sacred, believers tend to point first to its moral content." (p. 317) Fleischacker says this to confirm the priority of morality to revelation. This claim strikes this reader as biased. Believers will give many reasons for why they take a text as a revelation, including that they sense God or the Holy Spirit speaking to them through this text, that this truth has been handed down through tradition, or that the person who wrote it was not intellectually capable of creating it on his own. Fleischacker also tells us that Buddha's first followers were impressed by his moral teachings. This contradicts what I know of the Pali canon, where Buddha attracts followers by promising a release from suffering. Fleischacker altogether makes too much of an empirical claim that religious believers perceive morality as preceding revelation.

Fleischacker also tells us that religions start as rivals to science, and over time normally shift their emphasis to reinterpreting empirical claims as metaphorical. (p. 425) This is meant to confirm his claim that science precedes revelation. Fleischacker must live a very insulated life to be able to make that statement. Fundamentalist interpretations of creation, for example, are alive and well in all three monotheistic religions, and the denial of evolution is a glaring example of how religion continues to present itself as an alternative to science.

Regarding Judaism in particular, Fleischacker makes a number of assertions that can only be deemed apologetic in intent and less than acceptable. Such is his assertion on page 11 that "Judaism has long held that there are different legitimate paths to God," making Judaism out to be a pluralistic religion at its core. This hides the fact that for two millennia a dominant strand in Judaism has seen Christianity as idol worship, and the same for much of Eastern religions. Fleischacker, eager to present a religiously tolerant face of Judaism, ascribes to Maimonides the view that in the Messianic era the nations of the world will "stand in their own teaching." (p. 405) A reader might very well get the idea that Maimonides envisions a Messianic era with Christianity and Islam, Buddhism and Hinduism all thriving. The source Fleischacker cites for this does not refer to the Messianic era, and forgets that Maimonides was one of the strongest denouncers in Jewish history of Christianity as idol worship and undoubtedly would have thought the same of Eastern religions had he been familiar with them. He could not have envisioned these religions as part of a Messianic era.

Fleischacker tells the reader that the Orthodox Jewish community has worked quite hard to minimize sexist aspects of the Torah. This is grossly overstated. Only a small segment of that community has attempted to ameliorate the problems for women in Jewish law, and that within a narrow scope of application. Much of Orthodox Judaism has resisted changes or has been indifferent to the possibility of changes in their religious practice. In Israel especially, quite the reverse is the case for more conservative Orthodox Jews. Fleischacker also claims that there is no reason to think the Talmudic rabbis believed the oral Torah to have been dictated by God. (p. 393) He says this in favor of a responsible reception of the oral Torah through a plurality of interpretations. However, in saying this he ignores an important rabbinic tradition that "Whatever a senior pupil would be saying before his teacher in the future was said to Moses on Mt. Sinai." (Leviticus Rabbah, 22). Fleischacker also makes the astonishing pronouncement that "Certainty that one's own way is the only right one, and a concomitant intolerance of others, are not characteristic of Judaism." This defies anti-Christian and anti-Gentile polemics in the Talmud and Midrashic literature, as well as traditional Jewish laws reflecting negatively on heretics and Christians. These hyperbolic liberal pronouncements appear so as to illustrate Fleischacker's demand that morality precede believing in a revelatory text. Alas, our author protesteth religious liberalism far too much.

Fleischacker shows great eagerness to embrace secularist positions, save for his arguments against secular telic beliefs. This eagerness gets expressed in his granting to a secularist much beyond secular morality and science, with ill-advised arguments or without any argument at all. Here are some examples of the unbearable lightness with which Fleischacker, a religious person, accepts secular positions: In an appendix of only two and a half pages (!), he examines and dismisses proofs of God's existence and endorses problems with the very coherence of the classical God-concept. This he does without acknowledging the vast literature on these subjects, including defenses by religious philosophers. This discussion includes such non sequiturs as the assertion that if God is the source of all power, then God is both weak and strong because God is "the source of both the weakness of the tissue paper and the strength of the pen that pokes through it." (p. 474)

David Hume's dismissal of miracles receives quick endorsement on the grounds of the supremacy of science (p. 266). This discussion ignores the ample literature on Hume's argument, on various notions of "miracle," and on attempts to square miracles with science. Not only does Fleischacker accept secular science and morality, but also "our" philosophy of science which together with science "makes the idea of experiencing supernatural entities seem virtually incoherent." (p. 63) There is no discussion about whether a religious believer should accept that science entails the invalidity of religious experiences or whether she must accept "their" philosophy of science, which, after all, is not the same as science.

Fleischacker is dismissive of mystical knowledge because "No-one knows exactly what ["mystical"] means," unless it is another term for the unknowable (p. 338). But then the idea of mystical knowledge will be unintelligible. This ignores much historical and philosophical work on the nature of mystical experience and ineffability in recent decades. (To be fair, he does add an endorsement of the Kantian view of the impossibility of experience without concepts and Steven Katz's application of this dictum to mysticism.) He also rejects religious experience as having no epistemic value for religious belief. (p. 422)

Fleischacker simply assumes a secular way of thinking of the state of nature when he limits its focus to empirical and value statements. (pp. 37ff.) He does not consider that in a state of nature beliefs of a religious nature could be just as natural as others. If they were, then we would have to reform Fleischacker's conception of how the notion of truth arises. Fleischacker is little prepared to risk an epistemology at odds with secularism. He rejects Calvin's sensus divinitas because the idea, "speaks only to those who already have faith. . . . It is not a position likely to lead anyone to faith who does not already have it." (p. 35) This does not show that there is no sensus divinitas, and it is hard to see why the consideration he marshals should prevent a person of faith like himself from thinking there is such a sense. In any event, Fleischacker has never told the reader that an aim of his book is to convince a non-believer, and one could easily have gotten the impression otherwise. Does Fleischacker's denial of a sensus divinitas for the above reason reflect a keenness to stay on the secularist's good side as much as possible? He does say that the sensus divinitas goes against "our" science, but this must be argued for and not blandly assumed. Nowhere does he attend to the question of whether and how much science itself might reflect a secular bias rather than be religiously neutral in its assumptions and reasoning.

In one place Fleischacker says that it is simply a matter of faith that there are only empirical facts. (p. 267) Yet, he shows timidity when facing the question of non-empirical facts, except for God as the ultimate source of a revelation. The upshot of all of this is a noncritical acceptance of a cluster of secularist claims apparently because they are standard secular claims or acceptance on the merits of inadequate considerations.

The last section of this book turns to politics and claims for politics what the author has been defending throughout the book about science and morality -- politics belongs to the Way of the World and thus must be in place prior to revelation. Fleischacker argues for political liberalism and freedom from religious coercion in any form. He also reasons from the priority of politics to revelation to the conclusion that religious considerations should not enter into political debates. (p. 439)

In another one of the intriguing arguments of this book, Fleischacker approves of the existence of secular society for the good of religious folk. The existence of secular society, he says, helps foster genuine religious commitment. If everyone were religious, he reasons, the social pressures to be religious would be so coercive as to deprive people of their religious life being freely chosen. With a visible secular society alongside a religious one, an individual is afforded the freedom to leave her religion, if she so chooses, for the secular society which will affirm her choice. Thus, if she chooses to remain in her religion, her being religious will likely be due to a genuine commitment. There are two problems with this logic. The first is that it underestimates the potentially coercive nature of conservative religion, most especially when backlashing against secular society. Secondly, in the case of Fleischacker's Judaism, we need an argument as to why the great benefit he sees in the telic teaching of the Torah should not outweigh in his eyes a Jew’s following that telic path with less than full freedom. Even if we agree that freely choosing one's religion is a good, being on a good telic path not so freely might be more beneficial to a person than leaving it because of not following it in complete freedom.

I have been going on about the flaws in this book. So let me turn around and conclude by saying how important this book is. Fleischacker presents an extended argument with an expansive sweep, reminding one of how philosophy used to be done in the grand style. The book's architecture is imposing and its argumentation for its main ideas, as I have shown in part, often clever and fresh. This in itself makes reading its 475 pages of text and 58 pages of notes most worthwhile and exciting. The central idea of the book, telic justification, is a fresh departure in the endless discussions of proofs and disproofs of God, religious experience, and basic beliefs, and deserves to be seriously reckoned as a warranted way of coming to believe in revelation and in God. The book is studded with excellent critical discussions of Kant at important junctures, including Kant's idea of private reasoning, and displays a richness of philosophical exploration. The chapters on Judaism are most sensitive and show us a sincerely committed believer trying mightily to do the best he can for what he loves. So although the book is flawed, it definitely counts as an important advance over what has come before. Fleischacker's book should become an object of careful discussion serving for progress in philosophy of religion.