Does History Make Sense?: Hegel on the Historical Shapes of Justice

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Terry Pinkard, Does History Make Sense?: Hegel on the Historical Shapes of Justice, Harvard University Press, 2017, 272pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674971776.

Reviewed by Christopher Yeomans, Purdue University


Terry Pinkard's long-awaited contribution to the debate over the interpretation and contemporary significance of Hegel's theory of history does not disappoint. In many respects, this seems the book Pinkard was destined to write for us, combining as it does the masterful storytelling of both his Hegel biography and his book on Hegel's Phenomenology with his post-Kantian reading of Hegel's core thoughts on self-consciousness (e.g., in Hegel's Naturalism).[1] When one considers Pinkard's recent work alongside Paul Redding's on Hegel's philosophy of religion[2] and Robert Pippin's recent work on modern art,[3] one feels that the dominant program in Hegel studies over the last half century has now come into full bloom as an interpretation of the whole of Hegel's significance for us. In addition, Pinkard's book comes at a time of renewed interest in Hegel's philosophy of history from a variety of different directions, and so joins a chorus of voices rising to articulate the different forms of significance of Hegel's treatment of history.[4] Since Hegel is perhaps the philosopher in the Western canon most closely associated with historicism in general, the belatedness of this development in the Anglophone literature is somewhat of a surprise. But better late than never, and both the renewed interest and Pinkard's contribution are welcome indeed.

Interestingly, the book is structured thematically more than historically. Instead of following Hegel's lectures in their chronological or textual order, the book tracks the major issues that lie in the background of the reception of Hegel's philosophy of history. The first chapter, "Preliminaries: The Logic of Self-Conscious Animals," summarizes and extends not only Pinkard's conception of our "amphibian" nature from his Hegel's Naturalism, but also equally serves as the best concise summary of the general trend of the post-Kantian research program over the last decade or so. The second chapter, "Building an Idealist Conception of History," extends these thoughts to the construction of the topic of the philosophy of history itself. The third chapter is perhaps the most purely intriguing from the point of view of style, since it deals with the vexed question of Hegel's treatment of Africa and Asia. The fourth and longest chapter deals with the heart of Hegel's theory, namely his treatment of European modernity as a distinctive kind of historical phenomenon, and the fifth and final chapter takes up the question of teleology most explicitly.

It would be fundamentally wrong to characterize the book as an apologetics for Hegel's theory (it is most certainly not that); but structurally it clearly takes its brief from the series of objections to Hegel's view that characterizes the most common view of Hegel and of his philosophy of history in particular. Readers with such a background will think that they are being invited to drink the Hegelian Kool-Aid in its strongest form, and will certainly want to know just how strong it is on Pinkard's formulation of the mixture. In one respect the answer is, 'quite strong': "Most crucially for Hegel, the philosophical comprehension of history is a comprehension of how historically the metaphysics of subjectivity itself -- and not merely our conception of the metaphysics of subjectivity -- has changed" (3-4).

The ground for this view (and its plausibility) is largely constructed in the first chapter on the nature of self-conscious animality and defended in the final section on infinite ends. In that first chapter the key move is to distinguish between having reasons and being aware of reasons, where the second way of having reasons distinguishes the way self-conscious animals live out their animality (so that it is a form of the latter rather than something added on to it). Thus our reflective need to make sense of our reasons is not something added onto our freedom to act on reasons as another layer, but the very heart of how we act on reasons. To this is added a further layer within reasons, namely the difference between monadic and dyadic reasons: the former concern only the agent herself but the latter concern authority relations between agents that constitute the structure of mutual recognition (28-9). And one final piece is the distinction between finite and infinite ends:

Finite ends may simply add up, but infinite ends are never exhausted by the actions that manifest them. Finite ends . . . expire, but infinite ends have no intrinsic limit. They require a continual sustaining activity for them to be effective . . . An infinite end has no limit at which it has finally been accomplished. (42)

All of the typically Hegelian goods -- e.g., freedom, justice, and reconciliation -- turn out on this account to be infinite ends. When one puts these pieces together, one has the basic motor of historical change:

A crucial part of Hegel's philosophy of history has to do with how the need to make sense of things leads to a conception of justice, which as history develops, transforms itself into a conception of the necessity of freedom. The infinite end at work in history is that of self-comprehension and therefore that of justice, and, in our time, that demand for justice has become a demand for freedom . . . The struggle over recognition is the ongoing thread in history that is the basis of justice as an infinite end in historical movement. The struggle over authority that is at the basis of the dialectic of mastery and servitude has crystallized into various institutions and practices -- the "universal self-consciousness" of which Hegel speaks -- that anchor the authority that percolates out of it in practice (or, we might say, which attempts to anchor it while often failing to do so in either the short or the long term). (44)

But to come back to the question of the strength of the Kool-Aid, there is another sense in which the answer is substantially weaker, for these conceptual resources generate a radically open version of Hegel's philosophy of history -- and given his mistakes about non-European history, even more open than Hegel himself thought (165). The core of the infinite end is not any particular human need or structure, but only the abstract conception of subjectivity Hegel develops in the Logic. That abstract conception is the necessary key to making sense of history, even though both the particular path taken by history and even the fact that it makes sense in light of that conception of subjectivity are contingent (148-9).

Unfortunately, there is no room in a short review to get into the details of Pinkard's illuminating treatment of specific historical episodes and their relation to each other. But it is nonetheless worth saying something briefly about the third chapter, "Hegel's False Start: Non-Europeans as Failed Europeans." It is a kind of stylistic masterpiece of recognition that manages to constantly foreground the lazy and racist aspects of Hegel's treatment of Africa, China, India, Persia and Egypt while also disentangling the important arguments Hegel wanted to make to his contemporaries by means of those examples. Pinkard's concluding paragraph is worth quoting in full:

In the last analysis, Hegel's rather negative characterization of non-European shapes of life turns out to be less about them (despite what Hegel himself actually thought it was about) and more about the problems inherent in any collective enterprise that either takes something like the "moral" to be equivalent to "actually existing social rules" or which takes its own collective project to be simply unintelligible and thus available only [to] the mystical. Even though that may be a fundamental mischaracterization of the non-European shapes of life Hegel discusses, both options were live in Hegel's time for European life itself. In effect, Hegel was saying: See where this leads you? (67)

Of course, if the examples are essentially misdescribed, the strength of Hegel's argument with his contemporaries is substantially undermined. But we are not Hegel's contemporaries, and particularly in the philosophy of history there is no point in pretending that we are. As scholars interested in the interpretation of Hegel's thought, the key point here is that Hegel is using these (inaccurate) descriptions of non-European forms of life as a way to argue against two views that have often been mistaken for Hegel's own, i.e. one which reduces all normative obligations to my station and its duties, and another which dissolves all finite better-and-worse of institutions into a divine synthesis of the state.

One final comment, on the layout of the text itself: it is designed more with the beginning Hegel student or scholar from outside the field of Hegel studies in mind than those already deep into an engagement with Hegel's texts. There are 75 pages of endnotes, in which virtually all of the work with Hegel's texts and all of the interventions in the debates of the secondary literature are confined. For a Hegel wonk such as myself this seems a shame, as Pinkard's facility with Hegel's messy German texts and his knowledge of the relevant secondary literatures in both history and Hegel studies is second to none.[5] In particular, Pinkard's interventions into the debates about the proper interpretation of the form of historical necessity and the relation between historical periods are full of insights, but only for those willing to go on the expedition into the notes themselves. (There are some helpful summaries, however, that provide a map to the territory; see, e.g., 165-6.) On the other hand, it does create an extraordinarily readable text for the first 168 pages, one designed above all to combat the dominant view that Hegel's theory of history is ridiculous at best and pernicious at worst, a part of Hegel's thought to be either outright ignored or at least hollowed out of any particular commitments to the understanding of particular places and times. Depending on where one takes the current state of knowledge to lie, one might think that this is the primary issue to be addressed. And anyone who takes addressing this issue to the order of the day would be hard-pressed to find a better place to start than Pinkard's book.


[1] Hegel : A Biography (Cambridge University Press, 2000); Hegel's Phenomenology: The Sociality of Reason, (Cambridge University Press, 1996); and Hegel's Naturalism: Mind, Nature, And The Final Ends Of Life (Oxford University Press, 2013).

[2] Paolo Diego Bubbio and Paul Redding, eds., Religion After Kant: God and Culture in the Idealist Era, (Cambridge Scholars Publishing, 2012).

[3] After the Beautiful: Hegel and the Philosophy of Pictorial Modernism (University Of Chicago Press, 2015).

[4] See Mark Alznauer, Hegel's Theory of Responsibility (Cambridge University Press, 2015); Tim Rojek, Hegels Begriff der Weltgeschichte. Eine wissenschaftstheoretische Studie (De Gruyter, 2017); Rebecca Comay, Mourning Sickness: Hegel and the French Revolution (Stanford University Press, 2010); Susan Buck-Morss, Hegel, Haiti, and Universal History (University of Pittsburgh Press, 2009); Eric Michael Dale, Hegel, the End of History, and the Future (Cambridge University Press, 2014); and Rachel Zuckert and James Kreines, eds., Hegel on Philosophy in History (Cambridge University Press, 2017).

[5] On the many issues surrounding the textual basis for interpreting Hegel's view, see Rojek, Hegels Begriff der Weltgeschichte, chap. 1.