Does Judaism Condone Violence? Holiness and Ethics in the Jewish Tradition

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Alan L. Mittleman, Does Judaism Condone Violence? Holiness and Ethics in the Jewish Tradition, Princeton University Press, 2018, 227pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691174235.

Reviewed by James A. Diamond, University of Waterloo


In his most recent book, Alan Mittleman, an eminent Jewish philosopher and ethicist, courageously builds a philosophical defense of 'holiness', a religious idea that seems hopelessly indefensible in a modern liberal democracy. The challenge he confronts is formidable considering that holiness has received a lot of bad press of late. The near daily spate of suicide bombings, torture, rape, and enslavement of those not of like religious mind purportedly in the name of holiness or jihad underscores the demonic elements of a religious term normally associated with an edifying notion of sanctity. It is simply not enough to dismiss these actions as unholy or profane since many of them are committed with a sincere religious conviction in their sacredness.

Mittleman's book further advances what can be considered a lifelong project related to his deep-seated concern for religious ethics. It is a welcome addition to the Jewish ethical theory he explored previously within the context of such themes as covenant (A Short History of Jewish Ethics: Conduct and Character in the Context of CovenantChichester, UK: Wiley-Blackwell, 2012), politics (The Scepter Shall Not Depart from Judah: Perspectives on the Persistence of the Political in Judaism, Lanham, MD: Lexington Books, 2000), and a civil society (Religion as a Public Good: Jews and Other Americans on Religion in the Public Square, Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 2003). It also should be considered a companion volume to the collection he edited on Holiness in Jewish Thought, which presents several scholarly voices on the issue. His own elegant book-length disquisition on holiness veers away from a historical reductionist account of it in Judaism to a philosophical treatment of it, peeling away its various layers of meaning to reveal what holiness can positively contribute to ethical theory.

As the title intriguingly evokes, the connecting 'and' between 'ethics' and 'holiness' in the sub-title, following the main title's question, intimates the dismal possibility of mutually exclusive alternatives. There can be either a partnership or rivalry between the two. Mittleman's book goes a long philosophical way toward cementing a mutually beneficial partnership. His self-declared aim is to offer a work of "Jewish philosophy" that is constructive and normative, that "works in the idioms of philosophical theology and ethics" (p.3) in order to advance a theory of holiness purged of the violence it is so often associated with. Mittleman does "Jewish philosophy" in the only way that exercise can be done:  by engaging the texts of the Jewish tradition ranging from the Hebrew Bible, the Talmud, Maimonides, mystical sources such as the Zohar to twentieth century Jewish philosophers such as Franz Rosenzweig, Joseph Soloveitchik and Michael Wyschogrod. Along the way he enlists critical works on ethical and legal theory outside that tradition from Plato to Hume, Kant, Wittgenstein, Rawls, and Dworkin to tease out a philosophically coherent value-based theory of holiness.

The original biblical meaning of 'holiness', or qedushah in Hebrew, is distinct or separate, endowing its bearer with a certain preeminence. It can be spatial, temporal, or human, indicating some closer proximity to God than usual. Since the Hebrew Bible repeatedly emphasizes holiness as God's state of being, material embodiments of holiness somehow share in that state and command accordingly an enhanced reverence. It designates extraordinariness and so angels, human beings, and God alike proclaim God's holiness as a declaration of His supreme uniqueness. Hannah, the prophet Samuel's mother, most poignantly expresses this in her poetic tribute to God for having resolved her despair of childlessness: There is no holy one like the Lord, Truly there is none beside You (1 Sam 2:2). God's final rescue of the Israelites from Egypt's grip at the splitting of the sea elicits a similar declaration on a national scale: Who is like You, majestic in holiness (Exod. 15:11). And, finally, God Herself corroborates this notion when She addresses Israel as I am Your Holy One, the Lord, Your King, the Creator of Israel (Isa. 43:15).

This last illustration however reflects the dangers of holiness that can perversely lead to the inhumanity I described at the opening. When ideals, especially those sanctified by religion, assume particularistic forms, they can become toxically volatile. Note this holy Being identifies Himself as king and creator of one particular nation, privileged a few verses later as God's chosen people, not sovereign and creator of the world and all its peoples. As a result, His nation mirrors His particularity on earth as a holy people (goy qadosh- Exod 19:6). Such a distinction can easily lapse into a supremacism which transforms the innocent term goy, absent holiness, into a derogatory reference to non-Jews. This attitude emerges from a biblical view that relates holiness to a property of things indicating some ontic uniqueness that distinguishes whatever bears holiness as inherently different from non-holy things. Mittleman seeks to overcome this by understanding holiness as a value "project" (p.49) rather than simply a marker of status or property.

Of course, there is nothing new under the sun. Holiness has been an equal opportunity promoter of untold bloodshed and cruelty. During the Crusades in the middle ages, violence was not only condoned but sanctified to wrest control of the holy city of Jerusalem, in the Holy land, the site of the Holy Sepulchre, and the holy Temple Mount. Piety and devotion, the hallmarks of holiness, that formerly inspired contemplative orders evolved seamlessly into military orders. Jews often bore the brunt of this violence directed at their obstinate refusal to embrace the Holy Spirit of the Christian triune God. Trumped up charges of desecrating consecrated hosts, the ultimate violation of holiness, led to massacres and frequent condemnation of Jews to death at the stake. If there is any consolation in the powerlessness endemic to almost two millennia of Jewish experience it is that Jews were spared opportunities when they conceivably might have perpetrated the evils committed in the name of holiness by their ruling religious counterparts.

There are various proponents of conflicting views on holiness within Judaism's broad theological tent. The kabbalistic tradition exhibits a tendency toward constructing ontological distinctions between Jews and gentiles to the point where a 'holy seed' in the sense of procreation can emerge only from genetically pure Jewish blood. However, a long tradition from the ancient world to the modern identifies the holy also with the good. The biblical psalmist sees God's "holy habitation" as a fount for protection of the weak and vulnerable (Ps 68:6). A trend in post-biblical rabbinic Judaism diminishes the idea of holiness as an actual physical property. The classical rabbis, for example, identified holiness with the active rejection of sin and injustice. Moses Maimonides (1138-1205), the greatest of all medieval Jewish jurists and philosophers, explicitly states that a life suffused by holiness, in fact the very holiest of holies, which he locates in dedicated moral and intellectual pursuit, is a goal to which all human beings regardless of race can and must aspire.

For modern Jewish theologians such as Abraham Joshua Heschel and Solomon Schechter, ethics and the philosophical 'good' inform holiness but do not exhaust it. Heschel considered the idea of the good the ultimate for philosophers while the penultimate for Judaism -- "The good is the base, the holy is the summit." However, Mittleman is unhappy with both approaches. Ontological conceptions ascribing a quality of holiness to things, people, or places are rooted in beliefs in another metaphysical plane of existence that defies the rules of intelligibility governing our empirical reality. As a philosopher, Mittleman stands confounded by such an 'enchanted' world, which would entail cutting himself off from the 'cords of reason' that are the normal tools of his trade. On the other hand, it is difficult to determine what philosophical value Heschel's ethicized holiness adds beyond simply ethics. Mittleman locates that value in human beings' orientation toward transcendence, providing the language necessary to express the wonder and "gratitude for the strange fact that they exist." (p.88)

The book develops pivotal arguments in its second of three tightly constructed chapters on the relationship between holiness and ethics and what precisely holiness brings to the table that ethics doesn't offer. It moves beyond anthropological rationales based on a view of holiness and religion as evolutionary reflexes of a living species disposed toward morality as a means of self-preservation reducing holiness to a mere "evolutionary footnote to morality." (p.98) Rudolf Otto, the theological expert for any philosophical discussion of holiness, defines it as a fundamental encounter with the numinous. That also won't do because of the sequence in Otto's account of the holy, which places its experience at a basic orienting level distinct from and prior to morality. Although an essentially amoral primordial experience that is prior to morality might interpretively accord with the biblical encounters of God's incursions into sacred space, its philosophical usefulness is negligible. Rather Mittleman, anxious to preserve holiness' ethical value for Judaism, argues persuasively that "the natural roots of morality and of discovering and attributing sacredness are entangled," (p.112) not sequential. Jewish ritual accentuates holiness rather than originates it. Positivism which bifurcates fact and value does not account for the phenomenon of beings like children who demand our care because they "radiate sacred value." (p.128)

In the end, the book soberly inches forward in its search for the holy grail of holiness by combining the analytic tradition, represented by both its secular and religious versions in Iris Murdoch and Robert Adams, with the medieval rationalism of Maimonides. Both Murdoch and Adams find something of infinite value in finite experience like a glorious sunset which defies complete intelligibility and calls for some metaphysical realist account of it. For Maimonides the goodness of creation God revealed to Moses (Exod. 33:19), considered the summit of revelatory enlightenment, marks the outermost boundary of human intellection. It is a glimpse of the goodness God pronounced in Genesis, evoked by His panoramic view of the whole of creation. All three philosophers supply some of the basic ingredients for Mittleman's holiness recipe. Murdoch contributes some transcendent Good; Adams mixes in the entanglement of the good and the holy; and Maimonides tops it off with a cosmos that radiates goodness. The end product is a holy world that warrants protection and valuing. That holiness, is, as Mittleman caps off this chapter, "as close to God as we get." (p.153).

Now there is an independent Jewish state and Jews can thankfully exercise military and political power that is essential for its very survival. Mittleman addresses a disturbing marginal trend within religious Zionism that places holiness and ethics in tension. Seizing on a notion of holiness as a property uniquely apportioned to the nation and land of Israel, it is a trend that drains the enemy of holiness and thereby dehumanizes it. In its ontologizing of land and people holiness "sponsors a higher ethic" that is "unhinged from the good" (p.183) that surmounts any of the normal geopolitical considerations of competing interests and claims that could lead to rapprochement and peace. Mittleman's antidote that would restrain this impulse to disengage holiness from ethics is once again Maimonides and his demythologizing of God. Rather than emotive concretization of holiness Maimonides encourages a more abstract contemplative piety which focuses on "the awe-inspiring otherness of a God whose theophany overwhelms with its power to evoke the compelling force of value." (p.190)

Mittleman presents Jews and all those with a more spiritual, religious, value-seeking bent much to think about in their efforts to sanctify their lives. His critical thinking on this subject also provides a sorely needed safety valve for a spirituality that can all too easily run amok in its passion and particularity, regressing into violence and othering. I have always considered Judaism's undogmatic approach to religious beliefs and concepts one of its great assets. There are various approaches to the nature of God, the relationship between that transcendent Being and creation, and how best to cultivate that relationship and appreciate transcendence. Jewish theological elasticity allows one to combine elements from the mystical kabbalistic tradition with the Maimonidean rationalist one that is so apparently at odds with it.

Mittleman also references Rabbi Abraham Isaac Kook, the, if I may borrow a phrase from a non-Jewish monotheistic tradition, patron saint of religious Zionism, as a countervailing kabbalistic force against immoral holiness. Rabbi Kook's theology builds Torah holiness on, rather than disengaging it from, natural morality. I therefore conclude this review with a rumination on holiness by R. Kook that also captures many of the dimensions Mittleman's construct of holiness comprises:

the highest holiness is a holiness of silence, a holiness of existence where every human being acknowledges her insignificance as a particular individual and lives a life of inclusiveness, a life of the all; where he empathizes with inert, vegetative, and animal existence, with all of life, of every individual human being, of the life of every being that recognizes, apprehends, feels, and all of existence ascends together with her to its source, and that source reveals itself constantly on it and on him in the utmost of its beauty, its splendour, and its holiness peacefully and serenely.

Mittleman's holiness aspires toward harmony across all of existence rather than fragmentation.