Doubt and the Demands of Democratic Citizenship

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David R. Hiley, Doubt and the Demands of Democratic Citizenship, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 198pp., $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 052168451X.

Reviewed by J. Angelo Corlett, San Diego State University


This book seeks to provide a plausible answer to the public cynicism in the United States concerning the current state of politics and the widespread distrust of governments within the U.S.. The author believes that the answer lies, not in, say, political liberalism's insistence that democracy's strength is that it grants to each citizen the right to vote, but rather in citizenship that includes a certain kind of skepticism by citizens of a truly democratic society. It is the kind of skepticism that entails citizens' doubting in the midst of decisions that must be made in the context of disagreements between citizens. The author seeks to draw support for his main thesis from the respective thoughts and lives of Socrates, M. de Montaigne and J. J. Rousseau.

Besides a summary of each chapter's contents, the Introduction contains a definition of "democracy" as the author seeks to construe it (deliberatively) throughout the book. Chapter 1 contains an informative account of the cultures of distrust, cynicism and indifference in U.S. society and how they have pervaded and infected the quality of U.S. politics and society more generally. Borrowing from Jurgen Habermas, the author argues that the "deliberative turn" in political philosophy serves as an answer to this problem. In Chapter 2, the author argues that doubt is integral to a healthy democracy, as the quality of democratic citizenship depends on it. It is not a skepticism that leads to distrust, cynicism and indifference, but rather one that recognizes that not all social problems require consensus in order to be acted on reasonably, and such doubt requires that each citizen understand and accept her own fallibility. This democratic doubt is juxtaposed to the tyrant's lack of epistemic humility on problems of social import. Deliberative democracy "depends on the political process being equally open to all citizens, or at least to legitimate representatives of all citizens" (p. 52). The author astutely notes that "[i]ndifference is as much the enemy of democracy as intolerance. Indifference undermines our sense of conviction and resoluteness in areas of our lives that matter most" (p. 30). Chapter 3 consists in the author's defense of the claim that Socrates (especially in Plato's Apology 32a where Socrates states that "The true champion of justice, if he intends to survive even for a short time, must necessarily confine himself to private life and leave politics alone"[1]) exemplifies how democracy requires citizens to have both deep convictions and to subject those beliefs to "deep doubt." The author interprets this passage as meaning that "Socratic doubt calls forth a form of private life through which he joined the project of individual authenticity, the bonds of intimacy among friends, and duty to the polis" (p. 100). In Chapter 4, the author argues that the doubting that is central to democracy is that uncertainty that leads citizens to act with conviction (not dogmatically). Here philosophical support is drawn from Montaigne. Rousseau is the philosopher on whom Chapter 5 is focused. As the author sees it, "Rousseau's challenge is how to understand ourselves in relation to society in such a way that the common good forms part of our self-understanding at the same time that society makes possible individuality and a plurality of visions for one's life that individualism requires" (p. 129). The author argues that "Rousseau's solution to the problem suggests the possibility of assuring individuality within the context of irreducibly common social values that communitarianism requires; and furthermore, that this sense of individuality is integral to citizenship in a deliberative democracy" (p. 129). Chapter 6 is somewhat of a break from what precedes it in the book, though the author seeks to use higher educational institutions as models of deliberative democracy. He construes them as fundamentally democratic institutions given their tradition of shared governance: "… Despite the diversity of models and missions, we need universities and colleges to be agents for democracy" (p. 160). This can occur when society has a capacity for a conversation of diverse voices, a capacity for democratic communication, a capacity to hold strong convictions while recognizing one's own fallibility and the fallibility of one's convictions, and a democratic disposition to be skeptical in the relevant sense (pp. 172-173).

There are some incisive points made in the book concerning the importance of genuine uncertainty in the governing of our private and social lives, though I am uncertain of their novelty as the author makes little effort to engage in any serious and critical way more than a few of the several philosophical writings on the political ideas of at least Socrates and Rousseau. In fact, the book suffers from a case of shallow scholarship in general, and little effort is made by the author to distinguish in significant ways his version of democratic citizenship from versions that have developed this general standpoint before him. Issues of privacy and skepticism, just to name two specific ones, are not delved into with any depth but are instead glossed over by the author without even informing the reader that there are entire literatures on these and related problems in philosophy. This is important because it relates to the overall and putative plausibility and originality of the author's account. For if he has not done much to show us that he is working with plausible notions of privacy, skepticism and the like, then how is a reader to judge whether the arguments employing these categories are themselves plausible? Moreover, a few books and articles are cited on the theory of deliberative democracy, in many cases over and over again, without due attention shown to the vast array of writings on political philosophy that are quite relevant to the author's own argument but that would in some cases challenge his apparent assumption that democracy is the best or only way to have a reasonably just society. Perhaps this is due to the author's assumption that the vast number of writings on political philosophy within the dominant analytical tradition of philosophy that are directly relevant to the author's thesis are not worthy of center stage in this book. However, it would seem that the author's locution, "In the bland but useful terminology of analytic philosophy… " (p. 94) implies that such "bland" philosophy might be useful in addressing such problems. The reader, then, is left with a sense that this book, which lacks a concluding chapter and contains a noticeable number of misspellings (for example, Julia Annas' name is misspelled "Julia Annis" throughout discussions of Socrates and Plato and democratic doubt), is put together and published rather quickly without proper review and editing. Thus the book suffers from weakness of philosophical content as well as philosophically unrelated problems.

The book does address some central themes of political philosophy that have been discussed in recent years. However, the philosophical significance of the author's argumentation could be made clearer, the scholarship made much wider and deeper with respect to, for instance, the matter of how to understand Socrates' words at Apology 32a and contemporary political philosophy more broadly. Even worse, the book mischaracterizes the political liberalism of John Rawls, oversimplifying it in order to attempt to devise what (I assume) the author thinks is an original thesis -- one that is not or cannot be accommodated by Rawlsian political philosophy. He states that "liberal democracy comes down to voting, the rule of law, and individual rights" (p. 56). Elsewhere the author seems to admit that political liberalism amounts to more than this, but nonetheless refuses to explore Rawls' theory in order to give it a fair hearing (p. 137), stopping short of clarifying what "more" there is to political liberalism. The fact is that political liberalism (at least of the Rawlsian variety) does not rule out collective rights, nor need it do so, as a careful study of the research in contemporary political philosophy suggests. And there appears to be nothing significant about "deliberate democracy" that is found in the author's book that a generous reading[2] of Rawls would not have understood as part of Rawls' theory of justice as fairness. It seems as though the author is unaware of the more sophisticated and nuanced communitarian critiques of liberalism, and of the liberal defenses, ones that render the author's treatment of liberalism shallow and in some cases misleading.

Furthermore, the author does not provide reasons why democracy is to be preferred over certain alternative modes of government (or non-government, if the anarchists have it right). This is particularly troubling in light of the fact that the U.S. form of democracy is riddled throughout its history with mitigated and unmitigated racist evils it has wrought on various peoples -- especially American Indians and Blacks. And very much of that was done in the name of democracy, and not of the mere voting variety. It would appear, then, that there is good prima facie reason to doubt whether any form of democracy is up to the task of succeeding in not violating fundamental human rights -- and so horribly and incessantly as has been done in the U.S.! Perhaps it is, but the author provides no discussion of this most basic problem because the author fails to generate the problem of the need for democracy at the outset of the book. In this respect, the book's main thesis and line of reasoning is rather presumptuous, politically and philosophically speaking. To be sure, one way to resolve this set of difficulties is to address such evils by way of democratic and human rights and their legal support found in political liberalism. But the author seems to opt for the deliberative approach instead, one which, according to the author's view, seems to imply a different avenue of resolution.

Nor does the author see it appropriate for his account to say when, if ever, it might be appropriate to become non-democratic, and why. Perhaps most disappointing is the author's repeated insistence that violence is antithetical to democracy (violence is deemed dysfunctional, and the possibility of violence is inherent in conspiracy theories on p. 23). Indeed, the author states that "The enemy of skepticism first and foremost is dogmatism… The political analogue of epistemological opposition to dogmatism is opposition to violence" (p. 98). It is as if the author is unaware of the rich philosophical discussions (at least, in that "bland but useful terminology of analytic philosophy") of the just war theories and how they need to be incorporated into discussions of democratic life. There are many philosophers today and throughout history who have argued that there is little or nothing problematic about the use of violence per se (even in a democracy) so long as specific conditions of morally justified violence are satisfied by those who would employ it against, say, oppressors. In fact, the very foundations of U.S. democracy -- if it can rightly be called a democracy -- is in part quite violent, though rarely of the morally justified sort. Overall, one is left with a sense that the book is a rather unfinished project in not devising an underlying rationale for, and depth of analysis concerning, the author's own point of view. At the very least, the author owes the reader a reason why he will not do this if in fact he wishes not to, and note why.

In a time when the U.S. empire seeks to continue to spread its form of alleged democracy around the globe through a morally unjustified use of deadly violence, it is imperative that books written on democracy carefully explain precisely why democracy is a good thing, and what distinguishes good forms of it from impostors. In a certain way, the author attempts this in articulating a version of deliberative democratic citizenship. But his glibly and repeatedly implying that violence is something that is not appropriate in democracy promotes confusion and ignorance of the particular ways in which long-standing traditions in philosophy have argued meticulously about when violence might be morally justified. This is particularly true in the case of the U.S., a country the government and a majority of the citizens of which recently approved and permitted an institutionally and morally unjust regime to rise to power in recent years, only to then approve and permit it to invade two countries on false and unjust pretenses, killing thousands of innocent citizens. One would think that, under precisely such conditions, political violence is quite morally justified against such an evil regime. And if democracy is such a good thing, one would think that the author would have understood enough about political violence theory to know not to think that it is intelligent to simply assume that democracy is not in need of serious philosophical defense. And what about the notion of collective responsibility in a democratic regime? The author writes nothing about this central problem. How could it be that a theory of democratic citizenship can be written without wrestling with the conundrums of collective responsibility, whether it is role responsibility, institutional or non-institutional? Furthermore, why are not such horrific human rights violations addressed in the book? Is retributive justice in defense of human rights beyond the purview of deliberative democracy? If not, then such issues must become part of its focus. If so, then perhaps deliberative democracy is really little more than some insipid form of bourgeois ideology (though one ought not to judge all theories of deliberative democracy by its articulation in this book). In the end, grappling with such issues would provide a measure of depth to any theory of democracy.

What is needed today in political philosophy are in-depth treatments of how it is, for instance, that societies can better themselves in principled manners, not assuming that any particular kind of society is the benchmark of justice. This is what Rawls, for instance, attempts to provide. But this is precisely what is lacking in this book.

[1] The author relies on the translation of the said passage found in E. Huntington and H. Cairns, Editors, Plato: The Collected Dialogues (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1961). Compare the translation found in the more recent Cooper and Hutchinson collection of translations: "A man who really fights for justice must lead a private, not a public, life if he is to survive for even a short time" [John M. Cooper and D. S. Hutchinson, Editors, Plato: Complete Works (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1987), p. 29]. In comparing and contrasting these translations of the text in question, one might wonder if the author's interpretation of Apology 32a is plausible. It would have been helpful if the author had engaged other philosophers and classicists who have dealt with this passage with some degree of rigor.

[2] Ironically, the author endorses "a principle of interpretive charity" on page 14. Perhaps it is not intended to apply to the writings of the most influential philosopher of the previous century.