Duns Scotus and the Problem of Universals

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Todd Bates, Duns Scotus and the Problem of Universals, Continuum, 2010, 166pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062246.

Reviewed by Lloyd A. Newton, Benedictine College


This book is not, as the title suggests, a book primarily about Scotus or the problem of universals, at least not insofar as these problems were historically treated by Scotus and his contemporaries. There is no attempt to situate Scotus's solution to the problem of universals within his historical setting or to differentiate his views from many of his contemporaries (there are occasional comparisons with Aquinas and a brief mention of Avicenna, but nothing substantive), nor is there any extensive attempt to situate Scotus's views on universals within his larger philosophical framework. Rather, the book primarily uses Scotus's notions of common nature and haecceity to address contemporary problems in mereology. As the author himself admits in the opening line of his preface, "this opuscule presents the research of my dissertation" on "Scotus, universals, and mereology" (p. ix). Thus, Bates's work is closer in intention to something like Eleonore Stump's work on Aquinas than, say, Giorgio Pini's work on categories in Scotus. As a whole, the book consists of five uneven chapters: 1) "Scotus Recidivus"; 2) "On the Structure of Material Substance in Scotus' Metaphysics"; 3) "Substantial Natures: Neither Singular Nor Universal, but Common"; 4) "On Individuation by the Haecceity"; and 5) "Responses to Objections", chapters which I will evaluate in sequence (the chapters are uneven insofar as the first chapter is more of an introduction and the last chapter reads like an appendix).

Bates begins with a recognition of the opposition to his project by such authors as J.P. Moreland, Hilary Putnam, and Quine, viz., that Scotus is either unintelligible or that modern philosophy no longer needs such things as substantial forms. However, in defending Scotus, the best that Bates can offer is, in his own words, the claim that: "this monograph shall argue that there are some interesting things about which [Scotus] may well be right. In particular, I argue his theory of common natures is a plausible candidate for answering various contemporary problems about universals" (p. 2). Unfortunately, though, to claim that Scotus is merely 'interesting' or that he 'may be right' hardly justifies the next 140 pages of dense, poorly edited, text. In the first section of chapter one, which is probably the most lucid section of the work, Bates first lays out various aspects to the problem of universals. In contrast to nominalism, which denies that universals exist, Bates frames the problem of universals in terms of the question,

How do we explain resemblances between things? (p. 4)

In addressing this problem, Bates rejects the approach of semantic ascent, taken by Quine, David Armstrong, and Michael Devitt, on the grounds that it does not conclusively answer the problem one way or another, claiming that it is a false friend for both the realist and nominalist. Instead, taking his starting point from Scotus, Bates argues that the proper way to answer this problem is by an appeal to univocal causation. Quoting Scotus, he describes univocal causation thus:

even if no intellect existed, fire would still generate fire and destroy water. [1] And there would be some real unity of form between generator and generated, according to which unity univocal generation would occur. For the intellect that considers a case of generation [2] does not make the generation be univocal, but recognizes it to be univocal. (p. 11)

Given the importance of univocal generation to his solution to the problem of universals, Bates then turns, in the second main section of chapter one, to address the issue of event ontology, admitting that such a framework is foreign to Scotus's metaphysics. However, it is not clear to this reader why Bates includes this section. He does say that event ontology "is the received framework for answering metaphysical questions, including the problem of universals," but immediately afterwards he adds that "I am addressing the problem of universals from within the framework of Scotus' metaphysics, outside the framework of event ontology" (p. 14). Yet, in spite of this proviso, Bates then spends the next five pages discussing event ontology. Perhaps it is due to my own lack of familiarity with contemporary discussions of event ontology, but I found this entire section puzzling. Besides the vexing question of why he includes this section at all when he says otherwise, the next most troublesome aspect is the fact that Bates takes ample space to define the term 'universal' (understandable given the title of the book, but something that is fairly commonplace within philosophy), yet does not at all define Aristotle's idion argument, which he invokes as though it were common knowledge. Bates then finishes the chapter with a very brief section (less than a page and a half) on Scotus's notion of a common nature as something that is neither universal nor particular, but a tertium quid.

In the second chapter, which consists of three subsections, Bates outlines "Scotus' picture of material substance" in terms of "prime matter and substantial form" (p. 23). In the first section, Bates argues that a broadly-conceived Aristotelian substance ontology "better explains the fact of the persistence of continuants through change and the loss of their parts than contemporary theories of four-dimensionalism" (p. 24). In this section, Bates correctly contrasts Scotus's conception of prime matter, which is an entity in its own right, from Aquinas's conception of prime matter, which is pure potency without any existence on its own. In the second section, Bates defends the Aristotelian position that there are substantial forms based 1) on the fact that material substances have a greater unity than a heap has, and 2) on human cognition of universals. Bates then finishes this chapter in the third section by arguing that prime matter is really distinct from form. At this point in the monograph, though, Bates's presentation of Scotus's position is distressingly thin. There is no mention of the fact that for Scotus a material substance consists of a plurality of substantial forms, or that the form of a living thing is its soul, or that time and place for Scotus, as an Aristotelian, are not things or dimensions but rather accidental attributes that inhere in a substance.

In the third chapter, Bates turns to Scotus's famous teaching concerning common natures, namely that they are neither universal nor singular. Borrowing heavily from Joseph Owens's article on this topic, Bates contrasts Scotus's conception of the common nature with those of Avicenna and Aquinas. He then lays out and defends Scotus's teaching that there are different degrees of unity: an individual has a numerical unity, whereas a common nature has a less than numerical unity. Of course, if natures have a unity and existence of their own, that raises the troublesome question: "Are common natures Platonic forms?", which Bates then deals with in a very brief (five page) second section of the chapter.

In an attempt to explain why Scotus's common natures are not Platonic forms, Bates makes two arguments. First, he claims that a common nature never actually exists on its own apart from either its existence when it is contracted to a singular or its existence in the intellect when it is universal. Of course, this raises the question of what it means to say that the common nature has, or is, its own entity, since 'having an entity' presumably means that it exists somehow. As far as I could tell, Bates doesn't provide any textual support for this claim, nor does he try to reconcile how a common nature has its own entity but never actually exists. So even though he previously tried to distinguish Scotus's position from Aquinas's, in the end, the differences between the two philosophers seem to be merely verbal. Secondly, Bates argues that the community proper to a common nature is not a necessary attribute but is accidental to it. What is necessary, according to Bates, is the common nature's indifference to being either universal or singular. Once again, I could not find any textual support for such a claim. One last problem with this chapter, and not a slight one at that, is Bates's earlier claim that being is not univocal. Granted, in the context, Bates's claim pertains to how being is not univocal with respect to a substance and an accident, which is historically correct insofar as it pertains to Scotus's early commentary on the Categories, but is highly misleading insofar as it pertains to Scotus's mature thought.

In the fourth chapter, Bates rehearses two of Scotus's arguments in favor of haecceity as a principle of individuation. Both versions take the form of a disjunctive syllogism and give the impression that haecceity is an ad hoc principle. Bates summarizes one of the arguments thus (p. 87):

1. The common nature is individuated either by negations, existence, accidents such as quantity, matter, or a haecceity.

2. It is not individuated by negations, existence, accidents, or matter.

3. Therefore, it is individuated by a haecceity.

Bates then spends the remainder of the chapter distinguishing Scotus's notion of haecceity from contemporary versions, such as those by Robert Adams, Gary Rosenkrantz, Richard Swinburne, and David Kaplan. One weakness of the chapter is Bates's claim that the accidents of quantity and quality can exist on their own since "they are really distinct and separable from the substances in which they inhere" (p. 99). Presumably, such could be the case, at least for quantity, in the case of the Eucharist, or in general given an appeal to God's omnipotence, but Bates fails to provide any support for this assertion. Nor does he address the fact that if this were true, then ex hypothesi the separability of the accidents would undermine his argument for rejecting accidents as a principle of individuation.

In the final chapter, Bates address two potential objections to his overall project that Scotus does have a mereological conception of substance: one from the hypothetical claim that a substance cannot be reduced to matter and form, and a second potential objection based on his "incarnational theology" (p. 126). In order to address the first objection, Bates denies that Scotus would hold the following claim: "Mereological wholes are nothing over and above their parts" (p. 126). To flesh out his claim, Bates turns to Scotus's notion of act and potency. In doing so, however, he makes the very puzzling, and unsubstantiated, claim: "The matter and form of a substance, each being part of that substance, are each in potency to that substance, which stands as a single act to them" (p. 132).

This last quotation, I think, best encapsulates the difficulty I have with Bates's overall project: matter and form are not, for Scotus, potential parts to a third thing. Granted, unlike Aquinas, Scotus does think that matter has its own actuality, but as far as I can tell, matter is still, for Scotus, in potency to form, which is its act. Stated another way, matter and form are principles of a thing, either for its coming into existence or for its existence, but they are not, for that reason, parts of a thing. At times, Bates seems to be aware of this difficulty, e.g., when he reflects on Aristotle's analogy of the syllable BA, which must have some immaterial aspect, or order, in addition to its material elements (p. 129). But at other times, Bates speaks of a formal cause as though it were reducible to an efficient cause (p. 36). Overall, I find Bates's knowledge and understanding of Aristotelian physics in general, and Scotus's in particular, to be lacking. And while I commend his overall interest in Scotus and his attempt to make Scotus relevant, if his weak grasp of Scotus is any indication, then I doubt that contemporary readers interested in mereology will be convinced by his arguments either.

On a non-philosophical note, the book desperately needed to be edited better. In the first chapter there is a paragraph on p. 14 that is reprinted verbatim on p. 51. In other places, there is an incomplete sentence, a portion of a sentence duplicated (making no sense of the text), misuse or questionable uses of Latin phrases (which is disturbing for a text on a medieval philosopher who wrote in Latin), books cited in the endnotes that do not appear in the bibliography, incorrect page references in the index, a number of authors in the bibliography without a given name, and about a dozen or so typographical errors.