The Reason of the Gift

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Jean-Luc Marion, The Reason of the GiftStephen E. Lewis (tr.), University of Virginia Press, 2011, 113pp., $29.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780813931784.

Reviewed by Jeffrey L. Kosky, Washington & Lee University


The Reason of the Gift collects four essays by Jean-Luc Marion -- three of which were originally delivered as the James W. Richard Lectures at the University of Virginia, a fourth of which ("Remarks on the Origins of Gegebenheit in Heidegger's Thought") was added for the publication of this volume.

The first two essays ("The Phenomenological Origins of the Concept of Givenness" and "Remarks on the Origins of Gegebenheit in Heidegger's Thought") are careful historical analyses of important texts in which the concept of givenness was discovered and elaborated by the founding figures of the phenomenological tradition -- namely, Husserl and Heidegger. These essays situate the founders of phenomenology in their contemporary context, referring them to authors little read today yet influential at the time of Husserl and Heidegger, authors such as Natorp, Rickert, Lask, Bolzano, and Meinong. The final two essays ("Substitution and Solicitude: How Levinas Re-reads Heidegger" and "Sketch of a Phenomenological Concept of Sacrifice") are less historically oriented, highly original interpretations of issues and problems in the more recent history of phenomenology. Their titles indicate clearly what they concern.

A reader accustomed to the creative brilliance of the phenomenological works for which Marion is well known (Being Given: Toward a Phenomenology of Givenness, In Excess: Studies of Saturated Phenomena, The Erotic Phenomenon) might find strange and esoteric the meticulous historical scholarship of the first two essays. Such a reader might well wonder: Why? And what is at stake in the extended reference to the Neo-Kantian School and figures little read today?

By no means naive, these questions get at the necessity to which these essays respond. Having defined the field of contemporary phenomenology by opening the question of givenness, first for himself and now for many others, Marion is writing his history, establishing more securely the tradition to which his groundbreaking work belongs. This historical work becomes pressing for Marion because critics have questioned the status of givenness in philosophy in general and phenomenology in particular. These critics have equated givenness with a nonconstituted given, something given that would serve as a nonconceptual and 'merely' empirical foundation for subsequent philosophical knowledge, submitting it to a critique that follows the logic of Sellars's critique of "the Myth of the Given." If such a reading holds, it would disqualify the philosophical status of givenness.

Against such a reading of his work, Marion has always contended that givenness is not a matter of some thing, being, or object given, nor does it appear in some form of empiricism; givenness is rather a mode of phenomenality, a question of the how or manner of phenomena. A reduction to givenness thus serves not as a reference to empirical givens but as a means to distinguish objects and beings: the difference between object and being can be made by reference to their givenness -- that is to say, to their mode of phenomenalizing themselves. In works more familiar to his English readers (Being Given and so on), Marion sought to verify this phenomenological status of givenness through conceptual analysis. Here, he refutes the charges against the philosophical status of givenness by establishing the historical relevance of the concept as it emerges in distinction from the givens. Historical scholarship thus serves to address a contemporary polemic.

The genealogy of givenness in The Reason of the Gift is not exceptional in that it still traces the concept back to Heidegger and Husserl. What is novel in the story Marion tells here is that it shows that Husserl and Heidegger did not themselves invent the question of givenness but partook of a philosophical concern shared by their contemporaries and recent predecessors. Meinong, Bolzano and all of Neo-Kantianism reckoned seriously with the question of givenness, so seriously, Marion claims, that it could be taken up as a question by Husserl and Heidegger. The real question, then, is not whether or not to accept givenness in philosophy (all agreed on its importance), but defining and assessing its scope. Does it give representations, objects, beings, or phenomena, and is it accessed in Wissenschaft, Erkenntnistheorie and Gegenstandtheorie, phenomenology, or Seinsfrage? Marion argues compellingly that givenness determines phenomena and is therefore not itself any particular sort of given.

Having shown in chapter 1 that givenness is a philosophical concept and has a history, in chapter 2 Marion shows how some forms of the thought of givenness restrict it or abandon it in ways that compromise its potential to access phenomenality as such. This essay thus advances toward Marion's own position that givenness is a mode of phenomenality freed from all prior conditions, including, most notably, as readers will recall from his famous discussion of Husserl's "principle of all principles," the limit of the horizon and the anteriority of the I.

Taking his lead from a 1919 lecture course by Heidegger, Marion argues that what is at stake in the question of givenness is the very definition of philosophy: Is philosophy knowledge of things or an entry into experiencing world? Is philosophy a doctrine of knowledge or is it phenomenology, which is entry into life-world? A decision about these essential questions turns, Marion following Heidegger argues, on how one understands the given and its relation to givenness; in fact, some thoughts of the given block access to givenness. The example here is provided by the Neo-Kantian philosopher Natorp. Marion cites this text from Natorp: "the pure I is absolutely not a problem. It is a principle . . . 'Given' would mean moreover 'given to someone,' and, as we see again, to someone conscious. The conscious being is what, in its very concept the given already presupposes" (p. 38). Readers familiar with Marion's phenomenology of givenness will recognize here in Natorp's 'pure I' and 'given = given to someone' precisely one of the limits which Marion accuses Husserl of subtly placing on intuition, thereby betraying phenomenology's original breakthrough toward a givenness broadened unconditionally.

What is gained by this? What is gained by ascribing to Natorp the position that has been criticized in Husserl? I suspect that one major gain is to reinforce Marion's claim that givenness is a phenomenological concept by assigning what blocks access to phenomenality to alien influences in phenomenology -- that is to say, to what in Husserl might remain insufficiently detached from Neo-Kantian positions and theory of knowledge. Historical scholarship thus serves Marion to purify phenomenology of alien influences so as to better assert its prerogative to givenness.

The two essays making up the second half of this short book might initially seem unrelated to the first two. The third (on Levinas, Heidegger, and substitution) does not treat the issue of givenness explicitly and the fourth (on sacrifice) is a constructive interpretation with little reference to the history of phenomenology. The coherence of the book can be found, however, if we understand the second two essays as efforts to show us what it means to read certain figures and to address certain topics from within the phenomenological tradition established in the first two essays.

The essay on Levinas, for instance, takes Levinas's difficult and disturbing notion of substitution and asks what are the phenomenological reasons this concept emerges? Marion's answer is that the concept makes sense in the context of Levinas's debate with Heidegger, but, for Marion, this debate does not revolve around Levinas's supposed ethical criticism of Heideggerian mineness or thought of Being, but out of Levinas's concern to address the problem of the phenomenality of the self in its irreducible individuality or ipseity. This phenomenon, the self, was a longstanding aporia in traditional phenomenology, as individuality remained unconstituted for the transcendental I, indeed even on many readings for the ego. Heideggerian mineness, realized in being-toward-death, was intended to be one way of working through this impasse. With responsibility understood as substitution, Levinas operates a sort of phenomenological reduction that attains an "ipseity reduced to the irreplaceable" (p. 66; citing Otherwise than Being, 153), achieving individuation of the self in relation to the Other without passing through the autarky of the ego or the solitude of Heideggerian mineness.

A significant consequence of this approach to the concept of substitution is that it becomes what Marion calls an 'extra-moral' concept. Substitution is not fundamentally part of an ethics but part of the phenomenological project to attain the phenomenality of the self. Marion's invocation of the 'extra-moral' is supported by several important citations, including this from an interview with Levinas in Ethics and Infinity: "My task does not consist in constructing ethics; I only try to find its meaning . . . One can without doubt construct an ethics in function of what I have just said, but this is not my own theme" (p. 52; citing Ethics and Infinity, p. 90).

Now, this notion of the 'extra-moral' and the assertion that Levinas's concept of substitution emerges through an engagement with phenomenological questions, not with morals and the pain and suffering of others, may very well anger many keepers of the Levinas orthodoxy. But it does have an advantage: it lets us understand why Levinas would go to such an extreme of calling the self a "hostage" and claim that I am given in "the unlimited accusative of a persecution." Ethically and morally these notions make little to no sense. But, as Marion puts it, "as soon as one ceases to hear it in its ethical sense substitution loses its strange hyperbolic quality, because it assumes from that point forward an eminent and nonethical function -- that of putting into question the 'essence of being,' as philosophy (metaphysics and even phenomenology) presupposes it for defining man's 'subjectivity'" (p. 52). If one supposes that what Levinas is doing is constituting the phenomenon of the self as it appears in its irreducible ipseity, then, Marion claims, it makes sense that he would define my responsibility as responsibility for what the other is responsible for, even my own persecution, for in this way he can constitute the self in an individuality that is original to it.

The fourth and final essay returns English language readers to what might be more familiar topics and styles. Here Marion offers what he calls a "Sketch of a Phenomenological Concept of Sacrifice." As with the previous essay on Levinas, this should be seen as an example of what can be done if one interprets a particular thinker or concept within the phenomenological tradition.

In this particular case, Marion suggests, the phenomenology of givenness lets us think a notion of sacrifice today "in the epoch of nihilism in which we live" when "'the death of God' . . . has abolished any difference between sacred and profane" thereby making unthinkable the literal making sacred, sacrificium, of sacrifice (p. 69). Can we think of sacrifice without reverting to the nihilism that sees in it either pure destruction or an ascetic practice that hides, behind this destruction, a hidden project of self-construction of a self beholden to nobody but itself? Is sacrifice anything more than a will to destruction that would rather destroy itself than not destroy? Moreover, Marion contends, phenomenology lets us escape thinking sacrifice within the framework of economy, and even of the social sciences. In this framework he suggests, it serves not to give but to get -- favors from the gods, acceptance by the other, and so on -- and becomes interchangeable with exchange. In both cases, the truth of sacrifice (relinquishing without return) becomes its non-truth (renouncing in order to receive).

Confronted with this aporia, the impasse can become passable, Marion argues, if the gift given in sacrifice is reduced to its givenness. The move here is provocative and merits consideration: sacrifice converts possessions to gifts and thereby performs the eminently phenomenological function of rendering givenness visible. An exegesis of the story of Abraham and Isaac illustrates this. On Marion's reading, Abraham is called not to lose his son or dispossess himself of his son, but to restore his son to the status of gift by giving him to God who gives all and in particular gave Isaac. Abraham's sacrifice of Isaac thereby reduces a seeming possession (Isaac) to its prior givenness (a gift of God) such that it is seen as a gift, which is acknowledged as such in the act of giving it back -- i.e., sacrificing it. The sacrificial repetition of the gift thereby makes givenness manifest by "'seconding' it" (p. 83), giving it again and ratifying it. On Marion's reading, then, sacrifice is accomplished without destruction -- indeed it is accomplished by giving, not destroying -- and it is God himself who nullifies the putting to death as necessary to sacrifice when his angel stays the hand of Abraham.

A phenomenology of givenness, therefore, saves the phenomenon of sacrifice from the aporia in which it disappears when approached by nihilism, economy, and the social sciences. Inversely, one could say that sacrifice practices a reduction to givenness insofar as it makes appear not objects or beings but gifts. What is especially provocative about this is that the sacrificium which makes sacred also makes a return to givenness. Is the reduction to givenness then equivalent to making sacred? Is phenomenology of givenness a way to make the sacred in the mode of phenomena?