Early Modern Philosophy: Mind, Matter, and Metaphysics

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Christia Mercer and Eileen O'Neill (eds.), Early Modern Philosophy: Mind, Matter, and Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2005, 320 pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195177606.

Reviewed by Geoffrey Gorham, University of Wisconsin, Eau Claire


This volume collects fourteen previously unpublished essays by well known historians of early modern philosophy and science. Both editors, along with several contributors, are former students of the eminent Princeton philosopher Margaret Dauler Wilson (1939-1998), to whom the book is dedicated. Almost every author notes the influence of Wilson on their own work and on the discipline as a whole. Every major figure of the period is treated, with the surprising exception of Hume (perhaps because Wilson wrote relatively little about Hume). Bramhall, Cudworth, Malebranche, Fontenelle, and Masham are also discussed in detail, and Newton is very often in the background. The field of contributors, while restricted to English-speaking scholars, is remarkably distinguished: Michael Ayers, Jonathan Bennett, Edwin Curley, Daniel Garber, and on and on. All of the papers make solid contributions on important topics; several will become touchstones for ongoing work.

The volume's emphasis on metaphysics reflects the overall trend within the discipline, correcting a distorted concentration on epistemological issues that were more important to twentieth-century interpreters than their subjects. A number of the more compelling papers address metaphysical problems that arise within the natural philosophy of the period: the nature of matter, force, motion, and so on. From an historical point of view, this is again as it should be. For better or worse, the competing metaphysical systems of the time were inextricably entangled with scientific programs, especially the programs of Descartes and Newton. Not even the most idealist philosopher could ignore the new science of matter and motion.

So the historian will achieve a more accurate picture of early modern metaphysics by carefully attending to the scientific context, as for example Roger Woolhouse does in accounting for Locke's struggle to get clear about the nature of collision. It is debatable, of course, whether the historian of philosophy should be concerned primarily with historical exactitude, rather than philosophical analysis and critique. Indeed, several contributors to this volume (Ayers, Garber, Bennett) were recently party to a spirited discussion of this question in the literature. Notwithstanding this controversy, the editors assure us that all of the contributors accept this methodological principle: (1) the history of philosophy should aim to articulate how previous philosophers saw their projects. Depending on how (1) is interpreted, unanimous endorsement may or may not signal an 'historical turn' in early modern philosophy. In fact, the collection happily embodies the "pluralistic tolerance" about historiography that Margaret Wilson herself recommended ("History of Philosophy in Philosophy Today").

In what follows I provide a brief summary and evaluation of all fourteen papers. I depart from the historical ordering used in the volume, and group them instead into three broad categories: God, mind and body, and science. The few that don't fit are taken up at the end.

In the first of three papers on God's nature and existence, Edwin Curley develops an objection to Descartes's ontological argument that he hinted at in Descartes Against the Skeptics. Curley argues persuasively that Descartes should not be troubled by Gassendi's (and later Kant's) objection that existence is not a property. A more serious worry is that some of the properties of Descartes's supremely perfect being are incompatible. The most interesting putative incompatibility discussed by Curley is between God's agency and his omnipotence: an agent does one thing for the sake of another, but God can produce any desired end directly. Though this is not mentioned by Curley, many scholastic theologians would contend that God's power and perfection are enhanced rather than diminished by his employment of 'secondary causes'. It is not clear, however, whether Descartes's system leaves any room for secondary causality; indeed, he frequently says that God is the "total cause" of everything that happens.

Douglas Jesseph attempts to unify Berkeley's three arguments for God's existence: each is an inference to the best explanation. God is the best explanation for (i) the involuntary appearance of sensible ideas, (ii) the continued existence of things unperceived by finite minds, (iii) the remarkable capacity for the "visible language" of shades and colors to depict distances and figures. The difficulty is that inference to the best explanation is inductive, whereas Berkeley considers his proofs to be certain demonstrations. In response, Jesseph observes that inferences to the best explanation will yield certainty when "every possible explanation has been canvassed and all but one demonstration can be conclusively eliminated". (199) Jesseph brings out important features of Berkeley's reasoning that distinguish him from Aquinas and Descartes, such as his preference for immediate rather than abstract concepts of God. But if inference to the best explanation is allowed to mean inference to the only possible reason, it seems most of Aquinas's and Descartes's proofs would have to be lumped in with Berkeley's.

Jonathan Bennett offers a trenchant analysis of Bk. IV, Ch. 10 of Locke's Essay: "Of our Knowledge of the Existence of a God". In his trademark 'collegial' style Bennett begins by explaining how "Locke's principal argument for the existence of a god rests on three philosophical mistakes." (162) He then turns to Locke's account of God's relation to matter, where he uncovers the chapter's "richest treasures". The most valuable of these is Locke's "regulate argument" for God's immateriality, which Bennett usefully distinguishes from another argument in Chapter 10 which is itself remarkably similar to Leibniz's famous "mill" thought-experiment (Monadology 17). According to the (rather Davidsonian) regulate argument there is a regularity in thought which cannot be explained in mechanistic terms because it depends on reasons, aims and so on, i.e. teleology. Consideration of this argument leads into an illuminating and varied discussion of several metaphysical issues that continue to perplex Locke scholars: the possibility of thinking matter, the infinite divisibility of matter, and the relation between body and space.

Another group of four papers concerns mind-body problems. Michael Ayers asks why Descartes's discovery in the Second Meditation that "I am strictly speaking only a thing that thinks" isn't already sufficient for the Sixth Meditation's real distinction between mind and body. According to Ayers, what is achieved in the Second Meditation is an abstract concept of myself involving only thought, which leaves open the possibility that in reality my essence involves body. Subsequent meditation delivers a complete concept of myself warranting the ontological inference that my essence in reality consists of nothing but thought. Ayers maintains, I think correctly, that this avoids difficulties in standard accounts of the relation between the Second and Sixth Meditations. Whether Descartes saw things this way is much less clear. For, as Ayers notes, Descartes says in the 'Synopsis' that what is lacking at the end of the Second Meditation is not anything in the idea of myself as distinct from body, but rather the assurance that this (or any clear and distinct idea) is true. The best part of the paper is the second half, where Ayers expertly traces this distinction between the conceptual and ontological self through Locke, Hobbes, Kant, and contemporary philosophers like John McDowell.

From Princess Elizabeth to Margaret Wilson, careful readers of Descartes have been struck by the "arbitrary" character of mind-body interaction. Louis Loeb attempts to explain precisely how Cartesian interaction is (and is not) arbitrary. The difficulty, he argues, is not that mind and body are dissimilar, but rather that the various kinds of mind-brain connections are not "subsumed under more general connections from which they can be derived." (70) One might object that on this account mind-body interaction is no more "arbitrary" than the fundamental laws governing physical interaction, despite the fact that many, notably Elizabeth, have thought there is something especially obscure about mind-body interaction. Loeb points out that Cartesian interaction posits many more distinct, un-subsumed causal regularities than fundamental physics. But note that in science a unification of theories typically reveals that the subsumed processes share a common description at a more basic level. Perhaps the problem of non-subsumption and the problem of dissimilarity are not so different after all.

Catherine Wilson asks the very large question how Spinoza's "severe ontology" can support an ethical program that seems to privilege human nature and promise immortality. Her nuanced discussion leads to a simple answer: it can't. The problem is not unique to Spinoza, but characteristic of much modern philosophy. She suggests that an important lesson of recent moral theory is that we distort our moral understanding when we attempt to view ourselves "from nowhere", or as Spinoza would say, sub specie aeternitatis.

Daniel Garber manages to contribute something new and interesting to the already "enormous amount of speculation" about Spinoza's doctrine of the eternity of the human mind. The idea of the (essence of) the human body is part of the timeless mind of God. In this sense there are eternal minds corresponding to every body, not just human ones. But Spinoza also says that human minds are eternal if they have adequate ideas, since to that extent they share in God's perfectly adequate stock of ideas. Garber notes a tension here, though he does not resolve it: is my mind eternal "warts and all" or only insofar as I have adequate ideas? However, Garber does explain why we should care to achieve eternity through the possession of adequate ideas: when our ideas are adequate we banish fear and sadness (along with hope). But if the aim is really quietude then, as Catherine Wilson observes in her essay, strictly speaking "no metaphysical account of the eternal persistence of the mind would seem to be needed." (92)

A final group of three very fine papers deals with problems at the intersection of metaphysics and natural philosophy. Roger Woolhouse traces Locke's tortured path, through several drafts of the Essay, to the doctrine that the nature of body consists in the cohesion of solid, insensible parts. Extension is explained by solidity or impenetrability, exactly the reverse of Descartes's view. However, according to Woolhouse, Locke despaired of understanding either the mutual, or the internal, cohesion of the solid parts. Woolhouse discusses an additional "limit to Locke's mechanism", this one empirical rather than conceptual. Locke assumed that collisions must somehow involve the transfer of a particular quantity of motion. But he learned from a 1669 paper by Huygens that quantity of motion is not always conserved in collision, and concluded that simple transference captures only the "ordinariest" case.

The papers by Lisa Downing and Michael Friedman each convey a similarly complex interplay between metaphysics and natural philosophy. Downing identifies a conflict between Malebranche's occasionalism and his mechanistic opposition to gravitational action at a distance. Since all motions result from the general will of God, and matter is utterly inactive, why privilege contact motion? Berkeley, who conceived of the relation between God and natural regularities in a somewhat similar fashion, harbored no such scruples against Newtonianism (construed instrumentally at least). Downing's discussion beautifully illustrates how the strict occasionalist and the strict mechanist strains in Cartesianism (as represented by Malebranche and Fontenelle respectively) come apart in the face of Newton's achievement.

Friedman further defends his view, set out most fully in Kant and the Exact Sciences, that Kant's theory of human experience is built on his explanation of the possibility of exact mathematical (i.e. Newtonian) science. Contrary to standard interpretations, Kant's distinction between general and special metaphysics corresponds not to the distinction between common-sense and systematic experience, but rather to that between the transcendental metaphysics of the subject (the principles of understanding) and the categorical metaphysics of the objects of experience (the principles of pure natural science). Thus, the error of "rational psychology" is to treat the soul as an object of experience. This is not to say that the ideas of soul and god are subordinated to the principles of science. On the contrary, they are among the ideals of Reason that guide science toward a state of completion. Here is an important way in which Kant radically transformed the early modern dialectic of metaphysics and natural philosophy.

The other four papers are diverse in subject and method. Unlike most commentators on the First Meditation, Janet Broughton thinks the madness hypothesis supplements the dream argument in an important way. The latter permits the following sort of evasion: there is no fact of the matter about reality; 'real' is what best comports with my immediate experiences. Whereas in dreams I must infer from memory that I wrongly took something to be real, in Descartes's madness scenario I can perceive directly that the madman is deluded. There does seem to be an important difference here, but it's not clear the difference turns on dreaming vs. madness: I can observe the twitchings of my dog and know directly that his dream-squirrels are not real.

Robert Sleigh deftly summarizes the valuable correspondence between Lady Masham (nŽe Damaris Cudworth) and Leibniz, and speculates as to why Masham failed to press her strong philosophical case against unextended substance.

Vere Chappell surveys the notion of 'self-determination' in Bramhall, Cudworth, and Locke, finding little agreement. The first two are libertarians, giving the free agent the power to determine itself otherwise, while Locke is a compatibilist, holding that the will is always determined by a present desire or "uneasiness". There is a wrinkle in Locke's account: he says we have the power to suspend our desires and examine the options "on all sides". Chappell sheds a good deal of light on these conflicting doctrines by locating their source in the unsettled state of moral psychology, where medieval debates about voluntarism vs. intellectualism persisted.

According to Beatrice Longuenesse all agree that the core of Kant's response to Hume in the Second Analogy is that causality is presupposed in the representation of objective succession. It has been less evident to commentators how it follows that the phenomenal world itself is governed by necessary, causal laws. Strawson labeled Kant's argument "a non-sequitur of numbing grossness". Longuenesse provides a guarded defense of Kant, arguing that the necessity of causal connections is implied in our a priori intuition of time. In particular, our perception of such connections involves necessity in the Kantian sense of "existence at all times" insofar as the connection is "preserved though time" from cause to effect. Without such necessity there would be no individuation of events, nor unity or continuity in time itself. As Longuenesse seems to concede, no one would be convinced by this who had not already swallowed most of Kant's metaphysics (e.g. no Humean). Still, the intuition of time does seem to have a role in the Second Analogy, and Longuenesse offers a plausible suggestion what it might be.

I remarked earlier that the field of contributors to this collection is highly distinguished. It is also relatively senior: all but one (Lisa Downing) have full professor or emeritus standing; several occupy named chairs. Because the authors are so accomplished, one is not surprised that the papers are uniformly excellent. Nor is one disappointed -- quite the contrary -- that many of the entries develop or revise readings introduced in earlier works, or rejoin longstanding controversies about interpretation. The editors promise the "state of the art" in early modern philosophy, not its "cutting edge". In fulfilling that promise they provide a fitting testament to the legacy of Margaret Wilson.

Works Cited

Curley, E. M. 1978. Descartes Against the Skeptics. Oxford: Blackwell.

Friedman, Michael. 1992. Kant and the Exact Sciences. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Wilson, Margaret. 1991. "History of Philosophy in Philosophy Today; and the Case of the Sensible Qualities", Philosophical Review 101: 191-243.