Early Modern Women on Metaphysics

Placeholder book cover

Emily Thomas (ed.), Early Modern Women on Metaphysics, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 295pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107178687.

Reviewed by Julia Borcherding, New York University, University of Cambridge


In recent decades, scholars of early modern philosophy have increasingly striven to write a more inclusive history of the period, and, as part of that effort, to recover the writings of early modern women philosophers. In showing these writings to be both original and insightful, their scholarship underscores not only the historical importance of early modern women’s writings. It also — given the crucial role of the early modern period in shaping our present philosophical concerns — highlights their importance to our understanding of philosophy as we now practice it. In engaging with the work of early modern women philosophers, we may thus hope not only to arrive at a fuller history of our discipline, but also at a richer understanding of our own projects as philosophers today. The collection of essays reviewed here is part of an upswing in high-quality volumes and monographs on early modern women philosophers that will prove instrumental in helping us to achieve both.

While a recent volume, edited by Jacqueline Broad and Karen Detlefsen (Women and Liberty, 1600-1800: Philosophical Essays, OUP, 2017, centers on early modern women’s thought on freedom and political liberty, the present collection turns to metaphysical themes in the writings of nine 17th- and 18th-century women philosophers (Bathsua Makin, Anna Maria van Schurman, Elisabeth of Bohemia, Margaret Cavendish, Anne Conway, Damaris Masham, Mary Astell, Catharine Trotter Cockburn, and Émilie Du Châtelet). The thirteen essays each present a self-standing and original contribution to current scholarship, and as such can be fruitfully explored in a selective manner. Nonetheless, should your time permit it, a cover-to-cover reading is highly recommended, as it powerfully conveys the richness and depth of early modern women’s contributions to an area of philosophy that is traditionally much less naturally thought of as one in which female thought could thrive — a preconception that the present volume should do much to dispel.

The volume has five thematic sections: meta-metaphysics, metaphysics of science, ontology, metaphysics of mind and selves, and, last but certainly not least, metaphysics of morality. Marcy P. Lascano explores meta-metaphysics, through the lens of Masham’s views regarding metaphysics’ nature and scope (“‘Heads Cast in Metaphysical Moulds’: Damaris Masham on the Method and Nature of Metaphysics”). Situating Masham within 17th-century debates concerning the subject matter and methodology of metaphysics, Lascano convincingly shows that despite her largely skeptical stance, Masham — whose preferred way of employing the term “metaphysicks” was an insult for those “unacquainted with the World, and Humane Nature” — nonetheless manages to successfully carve out a space for the investigation of divine and human nature via experience and reason.

Contributions by Susan James, Andrew Janiak, and Karen Detlefsen address metaphysics of science. Both James’ and Detlefsen’s chapters productively put the views of their author (in this instance, Cavendish) in touch with more contemporary feminist thought. They thereby also highlight an important meta-theme (explicitly addressed by Detlefsen) relevant to much recent scholarship inquiring into the thought of early modern women: Can we find — and how can we find — meaningful ways of conceiving of past thinkers as feminist, while avoiding both the threat of anachronism arising from an attribution of feminism that ignores historical context, as well as the danger of antiquarianism which looms for more contextual approaches? A virtue of both James’ and Detlefsen’s chapters is that they not only manage to avoid these threats, but also succeed in showing that we may productively inquire not only into feminist threads tying together pre-modern and modern approaches to ethics and political theory, but also into those that may connect pre-modern and modern approaches to the philosophy of science and the study of nature.

James’ “‘Hermaphroditical Mixtures’: Margaret Cavendish on Nature and Art” expands on feminist readings of Cavendish’s natural philosophy to reveal the true force of her critique of the “arts” of experimental philosophy, chemistry and microscopy. Instead of reading her as unreflectively adopting the conservative stance that the experimental arts cannot transform nature, James shows that Cavendish regards the pursuit of these arts not simply as manifestations of a desire to create, but indeed tries to unmask them as the far more problematic desire to outdo and control nature. Detlefsen’s contribution (“Margaret Cavendish on Laws and Order”), in turn, locates Cavendish’s thinking on laws of nature and order in the natural world within the historical shift from an older (deistic and prescriptive) to a more modern (naturalistic and descriptive) account of natural laws. In doing so, she carves out a unique middle-position for Cavendish, owing to her highly original conception of nature as both conscious and self-guided, and makes a compelling case that the resulting view bears some striking similarities to Evelyn Fox Keller’s feminist critique of the concept of a “law of nature”.

Complementing these two essays on Cavendish, Janiak’s “Émilie Du Châtelet: Physics, Metaphysics and the Case of Gravity” explores Du Châtelet’s role in the history of the metaphysics of science. Through a careful study of her treatment of gravity, Janiak takes on a wide-spread reading of Du Châtelet’s Institutions that regards the work as an attempt to provide a metaphysical foundation for Newton’s physics, and makes the intriguing argument that in fact, the inverse is the case: Instead of trying to provide metaphysical grounds for an existing Newtonian physics, Du Châtelet uses metaphysical notions in an attempt to build a new physics whose systematicity and precision would surpass Newton’s own.

The third and longest section leads us into the realm of ontology. Taken together, these chapters further succeed in illustrating both the tremendous variety and depth of early modern women’s metaphysical reflections. In (“Bathsua Makin and Anna Maria van Schurman: Education and the Metaphysics of Being a Woman”, Sarah L. Uckelman proposes that we can learn much about the metaphysics of gender proposed by early modern female thinkers through the lens of their treatises on education. In exploring the metaphysical foundations of van Schurman’s and Makin’s arguments in support of the education of women, Uckelman shows that their writings on education really double as treatises in metaphysics, insofar as they both view the question whether women should be educated to be inextricably tied to prior questions concerning female nature — whether women, given their nature, can be educated.

Directing our attention back to Cavendish’s metaphysics, the essay by Deborah Boyle turns our gaze in a very different direction. Cavendish, Boyle points out, seems to have simultaneously held two contradictory theses: that the universe is eternal and that it was created ex nihilo. Opposing earlier interpretations, Boyle skillfully develops a reading on which Cavendish is indeed committed to both of these claims, but on which they also no longer conflict: Cavendish, she argues, might best be viewed as defending an emanation account of creation that understands creation ex nihilo to indicate priority of nature rather than temporal succession. Moreover, Boyle suggests in a lovely final twist, we might even suspect that Cavendish conceived of ex nihilo creation as an expression of artistic creativity or “wit”: Just as she viewed her own novels and plays as creative productions out of nothing, she may have regarded nature as a creative expression of God’s divine wit. And just as she viewed her own fictions and fancies as establishing her eternal fame, she may have held the same to be true of God and his eternal book of nature.

Continuing with the theme of ontology and temporality, Thomas’ contribution centers our focus on yet another tricky metaphysical question, this time to be tackled not by Cavendish, but by Conway (“Anne Conway on the Identity of Creatures over Time”): Given Conway’s commitment to a metaphysics that allows a creature to change both radically and continuously, how can she account for a creature’s identity through time? Delivering a compelling critique of Peter Loptson’s influential reading of Conway as a haecceity theorist, Thomas suggests we read Conway as defending a more traditional account that grounds creaturely identity in sameness of soul or substance. At the same time, however, we should note the important twist Conway adds to this traditional view: instead of viewing the soul as a single, indivisible substance, she regards it as a tightly unified system of spirits, rendered stable through God’s design.

Bookending this section, Katherine Brading’s “Émilie Du Châtelet and the Problem of Bodies” examines Du Châtelet’s solution to yet a further metaphysical puzzle. For both Descartes and Newton, bodies are the subject matter of physical laws — but how can indeterminate, seemingly infinitely divisible extension admit of such determinate parts? Brading presents Du Châtelet’s novel solution to this problem, but also — here nicely connecting to a theme from Janiak’s earlier chapter on Du Châtelet — shows that this solution (arrived at through reflection on first principles) stands in considerable tension with a view of gravitation which, by the lights of her own methodology, the empirical evidence available should have compelled her to adopt. However, Brading further suggests, rather than faulting Du Châtelet for failing to resolve this tension, we should regard her ability to make it felt as one of her major contributions to the story of the search for a unified theory of matter.

The fourth part,“Metaphysics of Mind and Selves”, brings together three contributions that reflect on the diverse ways in which early modern women conceptualized and re-conceptualized metaphysical dimensions of the self. Frederique Janssen-Lauret’s “Elisabeth of Bohemia as a Naturalistic Dualist” expands on recent scholarship of Elisabeth that attempts to reconstruct her own views, rather than regarding her merely as a critic of Descartes. Against materialist interpretations of Elisabeth’s position, Janssen-Lauret advances a novel reading of her as a non-reductive “naturalistic dualist”, who holds that the principal attribute of the mind remains yet to be discovered through further philosophical and empirical investigation into the mind’s properties — a position, Janssen-Lauret suggests, which closely allies her to many contemporary dualists.

Picking up where Boyle’s chapter on Cavendish left off, David Cunning’s “Margaret Cavendish on the Metaphysics of Imagination and the Dramatic Force of the Imaginary World” delivers a wonderful exploration of Cavendish’s views on the creative powers of the imagination. Far from dismissing the workings of imagination as an impediment to knowledge and morality like many of her contemporaries, Cavendish, Cunning shows, emphasizes the positive, active role of the imagination in effecting both natural motion and social change. Here, Cunning beautifully highlights how, for Cavendish, the imagination can serve as a powerful tool for women and other oppressed groups: Through creating fictional worlds in which their abilities — now unimpeded by their actual social environment — can be shown to flourish, they can overcome challenges to their epistemic authority and combat prejudices against them.

Jacqueline Broad’s “Mary Astell’s Malebranchean Concept of the Self”, finally, turns the spotlight to Mary Astell and the metaphysical concept of selfhood at the center of her feminist philosophy. Against a reading that regards Astell as committed to an orthodox Cartesian notion of the self, Broad argues that her view is in fact much closer to Malebranche’s and Norris’ understanding of the self as something that cannot be distinctly known to us. By means of a careful examination of the concept of self at work in Astell’s feminist arguments, Broad shows that her view is as subtle as it is modern: For while Astell denies that we have a distinct idea of the self’s metaphysical essence, she simultaneously argues that we do have an internal awareness of our self and its abilities as something to be loved, preserved, and, most importantly, perfected.

A fifth and last section, dedicated to the metaphysics of morality, further illustrates how deeply the metaphysical views of many of the thinkers addressed in this volume intertwine with their moral ones. In two final chapters, Sarah Hutton (“Goodness in Anne Conway’s Metaphysics”) and Patricia Sheridan (“On Catharine Trotter Cockburn’s Metaphysics of Morality”) carefully outline the notions of the good at work in the philosophical systems of Conway and Cockburn. Taken together, the chapters reveal the strongly metaphysical character of both philosophers’ conceptions, as well as an intriguing parallel between them: for both Conway and Cockburn, goodness is not limited to the realm of human values, but extends to nature as a whole.

In her chapter on Conway, Hutton convincingly argues that the notion of goodness at play in her system is not a Christian moral one, but a metaphysical one anchored in Platonist thought and grounded in God as its transcendent principle. Exploring Conway’s account of the relationship between divine goodness and the goodness of the creator, Hutton shows that Conway embraces a Platonist conception of the good as an essential attribute of God that is communicated to all living things in nature, down to the smallest spiritual particles. A creature’s goodness, in turn, is connected to its volatility or mobility, which enables it to perfect its natural potential, and to thereby increase its similarity to the divine.

Sheridan’s chapter, in turn, lays open the metaphysical foundations of Cockburn’s moral philosophy, and explores how she combines natural teleology with the eudaemonism of traditional virtue ethics. Through examining a number of important features of Cockburn’s moral naturalism — its Stoic roots, its view of human nature, and its strong emphasis on normativity as independent of extrinsic sources — Sheridan shows that even though her view of morality is anthropocentric insofar as it emphasizes our sociability and rationality, it ultimately is a function of the broader natural order, anchored “in the immutable nature of things.” (249)

In conclusion, if there is anything that this rich collection of essays leaves to wish for, it is that it leaves one with a wish for more. Likely due to the continued scarcity of new editions and translations, many of its chapters focus on English-speaking philosophers (with the exception of van Schurman, du Châtelet and Elisabeth of Bohemia, all the women represented in the volume wrote in the English language). However, ultimately, this is less a flaw of the present volume than it is an illustration of the need for another one like it that would expand the range of the present one as further texts become more easily available. Moreover, the evenly high quality of the scholarship collected here should give us good cause to hope that we won’t have to wait too long for additional collections to be forthcoming.

Through its many forays into the breadth and complexity of early modern women’s metaphysical thought, Thomas’ volume not only succeeds in marking out the important role female philosophers played in shaping the history of both metaphysics and philosophy of science (as opposed to domains in which we perhaps think it more likely to find them, because they reflect the genres that were thought more “appropriate” for women at the time). It also, in exploring the many pathways between their metaphysical and their scientific, moral, epistemological, and political endeavors, manages to capture the fundamental interconnectedness that is a hallmark of early modern metaphysics. In this way, it manages to provide us not only with a new window onto the diverse modes in which philosophers pursued metaphysical inquiries in the past, but also with a telescope for discovering new inspirations for how we might to do so in the future.