Eighteenth Century Dissent and Cambridge Platonism: Reconceiving the Philosophy of Religion

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Louise Hickman, Eighteenth Century Dissent and Cambridge Platonism: Reconceiving the Philosophy of Religion, Routledge, 2017, 211pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138652415.

Reviewed by Sandrine Bergès, Bilkent University


This short volume is ambitious: it aims to offer both a clear and accurate account of a little known slice of the history of philosophy, and an argument for revising the way analytic philosophers conceive of philosophy of religion. I think it succeeds, to a large extent, in doing both. In particular, Louise Hickman offers what seems to me-- a historian of philosophy but not a specialist in the philosophy of religion—useful resources for rethinking some aspects of how natural theology is read and taught.

In her introduction, the author proposes that analytic philosophers fail to realize the potential of philosophy of religion by interpreting natural theology's reliance on reason as producing a set of dry arguments that negate the ethical and political aspects of religious thought. This ought to resonate with those who have found themselves teaching or being taught 'arguments for the existence of God' at the undergraduate level. At best, it is an exercise in recognizing the structure of arguments; at worst, it is the reason why students never want to look at philosophy of religion again. Hickman notes that philosophers dissatisfied with this state of affairs have simply turned away from natural theology, thus confirming old prejudices that analytic philosophy cannot offer rich insights into practical domains, such as religion, ethics, or politics.

In order to make the rehabilitation of analytic philosophy of religion possible, Hickman says, analytic philosophers need to strengthen another area -- that of the history of the discipline. I read her book as a historian, rather than a philosopher of religion, so I was in a better position to appreciate her contribution here. Hickman notes analytic philosophy's tendency to offer superficial, context free and highly selective looks at what our predecessors achieved. In the case of natural theology, she argues, what is in fact needed is a close look at two previously neglected periods of history: the philosophy of the rational dissenters of the late eighteenth century, and the influence on their thought of the seventeenth-century Cambridge Platonists.

Hickman looks in particular at the works of Richard Price, a rational dissenter who preached first in Newington Green (North London), and then in Wales. Price was influential as a mathematician (he found Bayes' theorem when sorting through Bayes' papers and submitted it to the Royal Society in 1763) and as a political thinker -- he was highly regarded by Franklin, Adams and Jefferson, and sparked the pamphlet war of the 1790s by publishing his lecture celebrating the French Revolution. This pamphlet war saw the publication of Mary Wollstonecraft's Vindication of the Rights of Men, and, in a final chapter, Hickman traces the influence of Price's natural theology on Wollstonecraft's moral and political thought. Although I was pleased to see an entire chapter dedicated to Wollstonecraft, I was less convinced by Hickman's analysis of her thought in terms of Platonism. I will explain why later.

Hickman, looking at a wide range of Price's work, argues that his ethical and political thought was thoroughly infused by his theology, and that his theology owed much to the Cambridge Platonists of the previous century. This is most apparent, she says, in Price's reliance on reason in his theology, but also in his moral and political philosophy.

Hickman shows that reason, for Price, is hardly the cold tool of logic that seems to rule contemporary analytic philosophy of religion. She emphasizes the Platonic character of Price's reason -- that is, as a goal setter, and a lover of virtue -- with all its psychological implications. For Price, she shows, reason is divine, rather than simply a tool humans use for reaching, ineffectively, towards God. Reason is not disconnected from the ethical domain, as it comes with a set of intellectual virtues: candor, humility and honesty, all of which Price put into practice in the running of the Newington Green dissenting community.

That reason is divine in a Platonic sense ensures the centrality of its moral and political aspects. Hickman notes that if Price follows the Plato of Theaetetus, godlike reason has to be 'just and pure'. Hickman spends a lot of time tracing the influence of Plato's thought on Price, and she is careful to underline that this influence came from the Cambridge Platonists, and through them, the Neo-Platonists, perhaps to a larger extent than through Plato himself. Nonetheless, she does attribute some straightforwardly Platonic views to Price, in particular, from the Republic. Hickman sees Price's understanding of the role of reason as derived from the Platonic tripartite soul, and sees this influence most clearly in Price's political thought, especially in his writings on the American and the French Revolution. Hickman reads Price's emphasis on freedom from tyranny as a version of Platonic psychology in which reason rules unfettered over the appetites and emotions.

This interpretation strikes me as problematic in a number of ways. First, it seems far-fetched to read the Platonic model as a defense of democracy. Hickman does this by arguing that the rule of reason represents a form of independence, with the appetites and emotions representing tyrannical others. She notes that although in the Republic the tripartite soul does not translate to democracy, Plato warns his readers that the city he depicts ought not to be treated as a model for real life constitutions. Although this would leave room in principle for a Platonic defense of democracy, other central texts, such as the Crito and the Apology, make it very difficult to see this as a legitimate reading of Plato.

A second concern with the Platonic psychology reading of Price is that it takes no account of Price's republicanism, which itself can be traced to his readings of ancient texts -- though perhaps, in this case, Aristotle and Cicero rather than Plato. Price's appeal to the idea that to be free means to be independent, that it means the absence of domination, be it from a tyrant or from laws institutions, or even poverty, shows him to be part of the eighteenth-century republican movement, alongside Paine, Condorcet, and Wollstonecraft (amongst others). This is not to deny the importance of Plato's influence on his theology and moral philosophy, or even his political thought, but it seems that some of the less convincing parts of Hickman's argument could be put down to her not acknowledging this aspect of Price's thought.

Hickman mentions Mary Astell in the final chapter, as a woman (besides Wollstonecraft) who worked on theology. Hickman could have added Anne Conway, Damaris Masham and perhaps others whose work yet has to be recovered. But it seems that an actual discussion of Astell on religious toleration and politics would have enriched Chapter Three. This chapter brings up the history of religious toleration in British politics and Dissenters' various attempt to make a place for themselves in political life despite their religion. Mary Astell famously contributed to part of that debate: the Dissenter's plea for 'moderation' that would allow them to take communion in the Church of England occasionally so that they may be eligible for office. Astell took a strong stance against this proposal, arguing that it radically misunderstood the meaning of moderation, and that it showed the dissenters to have less than firm religious convictions. (See Jaqueline Broad's The Philosophy of Mary Astell, 2015, OUP.) Although this debate is perhaps not essential to the understanding of Price's position, it seems to be not less so than those Hickman choses to focus on in this chapter, and it would have been an occasion to discuss the work of an author whose influence, like that of Price, has been diminished in histories of philosophy.

The final chapter focuses on Price's influence on Mary Wollstonecraft. It is undeniable that there is a strong tie between Price and Wollstonecraft, and that he was a great influence on her philosophy during her formative years and her residence in Newington Green. The discussion of Wollstonecraft's views on religion take on her early, middle and late work, as well as her husband's testimony in a biography hastily written in the weeks following her death. The latter source is no doubt unreliable. Godwin tried to minimize his wife's religious belief, portraying it as unreflexive, unsystematic, and even disappearing.

It is certainly right to see Wollstonecraft's theology as influencing her moral and political thought. The virtue of modesty, which she applies to the moral analysis of men and women's social interactions, and to the behavior of generals in war, is no doubt derived from her reading of the Bible. Yet, her readings are always rather critical -- she takes issue with several passages, with the confidence of a Church of England believer, but perhaps not the reverence for close reading and strict interpretation that a dissenter such as Price must have had. Also, although there are no doubt some Platonic strands in Wollstonecraft's thought (she seems to rely at times on a metaphysics inspired by the Symposium), there are also -- much more than in Price -- some Aristotelian ones. This is true in particular in her accounts of friendship and virtue. (See for instance Nancy Kendrick, "Wollstonecraft on Marriage as Virtue Friendship" in Bergès and Coffee, The Social and Political Philosophy of Mary Wollstonecraft, 2017, OUP). But what she has in common with Price -- other than Platonism -- and which is not brought out in Hickman's book, is her republicanism, an understanding of freedom as independence from tyrants, be they kings, husbands, social mores, or institutions. Hickman reads Wollstonecraft's emphasis on independence according to the same Platonic framework she sees in Price, that is, the dominion of reason over the sentiments and the appetites. This reading, however, pushes Wollstonecraft too far into a denigration of the emotions, to a place where her detractors like to find her. (See Martina Reuter's work on this, especially "The Role of Passions in Mary Wollstonecraft's Concept of Virtue", in Bergès and Coffee, 2017).

Wollstonecraft is always careful to make space for the emotions in her psychology, and even in her account of independence. But these emotions must be properly developed, in accordance with, rather than in the place of, reason. In that sense, she could be described as subscribing to the Platonic account of the soul: for Plato, reason must train the emotions to work alongside itself, not repress them. However, Wollstonecraft's emphasis on the role played by the emotions in the virtuous life is again more reminiscent of Aristotle than it is of Plato.

Hickman is right that looking at the history of the philosophy of religion helps cast a different, more interesting light on the arguments we routinely teach and write about in analytic philosophy. And her discussion of the rational dissenters, in particular Price, and the influence of Cambridge Platonism on their thought is fascinating. And because one way in which analytic philosophers mistreat the past is by erasing the contribution of women, Hickman is also to be praised for concluding her book with a chapter on Wollstonecraft, even if it turns out that Price's influence on her was perhaps more on her philosophical republicanism than on her theology.