Eliminativism, Objects, and Persons: The Virtues of Non-Existence

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Jiri Benovsky, Eliminativism, Objects, and Persons: The Virtues of Non-Existence, Routledge, 2019, 184pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367000219.

Reviewed by Robert Lockie, University of West London


This is a research monograph suitable for professional philosophers and graduate students working on any of the first order issues in metaphysics, but also (importantly) those interested in metaphilosophical issues, especially as these arise in metaphysics -- addressing the latter issues is the core aim, though not to the exclusion of the former. The first order issues dealt with in the work include the existence (the claimed non-existence) of ordinary objects, selves/persons, life and death, aesthetic and other objects (photographs and musical works); and (to a lesser extent, and partly to assist dealing with the former issues) the prospects for modal realism and interpretations of modality more generally, perdurantism vs endurantism, Humeanism vs Cartesianism, four dimensionalism, and temporal experience. The higher order issues include meta-metaphysics, the role of intuitions and common sense, the dissolution of certain [alleged] pseudo-disputes, but above all, the defense of eliminativism where this is seen as a kind of methodology. Benovsky works through different first order cases in metaphysics -- arguing for the non-existence of material objects, the self, aesthetic objects, etc. -- but for Benovsky, these are not just a collection of different cases: there is a common eliminativist methodology applicable to, and eliminative of, all (notwithstanding that the cases are different, and he does treat them as different).

'Eliminativism' long ago became a rather elastic term. It can be used as shorthand for the philosophical stance, adopted towards any claimed X, that X doesn't exist (often, though not exclusively, by way of a deflationary reductionism). It can be one way of making this claim (broadly, the way developed by Duhem, Sapir-Whorf, Quine, Hanson, Kuhn, early Rorty, Feyerabend, the Churchlands -- of holistic theory-framework-replacement in which a successor theory supersedes the predecessor theory in a way in which this precursor theory's ontology, explanada and explanans cease to be intelligible within the framework of the successor theory -- with this being the Ur sense of 'eliminativism'). Or it can be the second of these as applied to the theory framework of 'folk psychology'. Benovsky's take on 'eliminativism' is exclusively the first of these, and the first of these as applied to most things -- as the title indicates: objects and persons in particular, though most other things besides. There are, for Benovsky, no tables, but merely 'simples arranged tablewise' (1) -- indeed, as we shall see, sometimes even 'tablewise'. In material much influenced by certain schools of Buddhist thought, (an influence which leavens the work throughout), there are held to be no selves: "Thus, in a way similar to chairs, we can eliminate the Self because there are impermanent psychological states 'arranged Self-Wise'" (111). (He seeks to distinguish this latter position from Humeanism, e.g. in Chapter 6, though this reviewer was not wholly convinced; and he has need of Hume elsewhere, e.g. in Chapter 7). Likewise, there are no musical works and no photographs: "we do not need photographs because we have all the other entities like prints, we can then eliminate the existence of prints in terms of simples arranged print-wise, thus effectively embracing a full-blown eliminativism" (166). Unlike other exponents of a more partial version of this thesis, Benovsky allows no exceptions to his eliminativism: not conscious organisms (pace Merricks), not living things (pace van Inwagen) -- nothing is a special case. So, "'nothing is alive, we only say so'. The property of being alive simply doesn't exist, and the best reason for thinking this is that we don't need it" (76).

From this latter we see the metaphilosophical principle underlying Benovsky's eliminativism: if you don't need it, don't posit it.

The basic idea can be the same: an allegedly single entity, the Self, can be eliminated because there is a plurality of other entities which satisfy all our theoretical and practical needs, namely, successive impermanent psychological states/experiences arranged 'Self-Wise'. (65-6)

One wants to ask as to what these "theoretical and practical needs" are. Benovsky throughout has a very metaphysical conception of the former. Initially, I assumed his Buddhism addressed the latter (though in commendably honest work, e.g. in Chapter 8, he appears somewhat diffident about its ability to satisfy all such needs -- cf. 135ff). This assumption may be a misreading however, and it may be he has a more quotidian (and dismissive) conception of 'practical needs': "our phenomenal experience of the world, which is an experience as of chair(SIC) and as of tables, is entirely neutral with respect to the existence of chairs, tables, or arrangements of fundamental components" (16). The reader must judge whether he makes good this claim across all of the many items he claims to eliminate.

A paradigm of Benovsky's metaphysical take on the aforementioned 'theoretical needs' would be his invocation of Ockham's razor. There are different conceptions of this principle of parsimony, as he acknowledges in Chapter 1 (albeit, I felt, none too clearly); and, famously, these may compete with each other, as he acknowledges. Though the vulnerabilities for his position which certain of these competing notions of parsimony will bring in play were, I felt, introduced but not adequately followed through (parsimony of ontological fundamentals being bought at a price of extreme prolixity, indeed arbitrary, open-ended list-like computational intractability, at the level of epistemology/scientific predictivity /nomologicity/extension of a predicate/reference of a 'kind' or type-term, or other). In any event, the idea of 'theoretical and practical needs' in, say, the sense needed by a scientist, to predict (especially) and also control or explain (in surely this word's Echt, epistemic sense), play no role whatsoever in the arguments to be found in Benovsky's monograph. He talks of eliminativism's 'explanatory power', but "that is, its power to avoid or solve problem cases such as vagueness, composition and others" (5-6). There is not even an explicit consideration of avowedly metaphysical arguments in favor of eliminativism/reductionism derived from, say, Kim's Exclusion Problem, much less is there any attempt to indicate how we might eliminate, say, the self scientifically or practically in our predictions as to the whereabouts of a person given other human-level things such as their reasons, beliefs, desires, personality and intentions (Fodor, Compton, Popper, etc.). Considerations of 'explanatory power' and 'theoretical and practical need' from the standpoint of science (both narrowly and broadly conceived) rather than metaphysics -- for, say, such things as the gene, DNA, the atom, the molecule, 'inflation', 'predators', 'infection', a nervous system, a comet, an anticyclone, a learning history, . . . and all the predicates and ontologies of the special sciences -- play no role here. Remarkably, the ontology of the basic science(s) (presumably microphysics) plays no role either. By Chapter 7 we discover that the Ultimate Simples are not physical, and not mental -- but simples of a dual (actually, it transpires, trial) aspect theory -- neither 1) mental nor 2) physical but with these both aspects (not properties) of a monistic underlying reality that is intrinsically (at rock bottom) 3) intentional (this is the 'trial' aspect of this monism -- an intrinsic 'mineness'): intrinsically (at rock bottom) intentional yet also atomistic. This atomism (absent its 'intrinsic mineness') harks back to theories familiar to psychologists between about the 1860's and 1920's (the psychological structuralism of Wundt and Titchener) and to epistemologists from about the end of the nineteenth century to around the early 1960's (phenomenalism, sense datum theory, neutral monism).

When I have a rich experience, as for example when I admire the beauty of the alps at sunrise, this experience contains various elements -- reddish colours, shapes of mountains, the feeling of the wind on my face . . . Where does the mineness feature of the experience come from? (93)

The obvious answer is me, but that (at least, in strictu dictu, or 'Ontologese') is unavailable to the eliminativist of the self. So Benovsky retains the epistemological/psychological atomism but answers with his third component above

It [mineness] is an aspect of each of the individual elements of an experience ... it is understood here as 'accompanying' or as 'being an aspect of' or as 'being a part of' each of the individual elements. Thus, each element has its own intrinsic what-it-is-likeness and it also necessarily has a mineness aspect. (93)

This 'mineness' is a brute, as it were, 'fact of the grammar' -- and this position is profoundly atomistic at the psychological/epistemological level also. We have been in something a bit like this territory before, both in early analytic philosophy and at the very commencement of scientific psychology. One might ask oneself whether one wishes to go down this route again, but note that the resource of intrinsic 'mineness' is both novel to this view and central to preventing any simple transcendental argument against it (a cogito argument: your experience presupposes you, your self -- at least absent stock, implausible, Humean counters, which Benovsky claims to eschew). Whether there can be an intrinsic mineness which is sui generis yet also a profoundly atomistic property: whether such a putative notion is even intelligible -- that is, whether such a notion, of microscopic 'intrinsically mine' elements existing self-standing and logically/psychologically independent of and prior to a self, and independent also of any holistic, e.g. emergent properties coming into being only when such elements are assembled into a self, yet still, qua elements, seen as already possessing 'mineness' -- I leave to the reader to decide.

Benovsky makes bold, and rather swift claims on the basis of a number of examples across several areas that all (e.g. phenomenal) appearances would be entirely the same whether eliminativism or realism were the case: "what we see and what the world is like from the ontological point of view are just two entirely orthogonal issues. Our visual phenomenal experience would be the same whether there were chairs in front of us or 'only' fundamental components arranged chairwise" (30). He makes similar claims as to the reducibility of the appearances across a number of areas. Benovsky makes a subjective ontology vs objective ontology distinction, and argues to the effect that phenomenology/appearance is entirely orthogonal to ontology. It is worth noting that a reduction of the appearances in one domain may be feasible, and a reduction in another also; but that a reduction of both may not be possible (e.g., Benovsky attempts to deal with adequately: the reduction of chairs to chair-appearances-to-selves, and the reduction of selves to atomistic appearances that do not involve selves).

Benovsky deals with the appearance of those things he seeks to eliminate partly in the aforementioned epistemic ways but also with a linguistic resource. The latter is glossed as follows:

The sentence 'there are no mountains' is then true when it is uttered as a sentence in Ontologese (the fundamental language of the metaphysician), but this is compatible with the sentence 'there is a mountain in front of me' being true since it is a sentence in ordinary English. In Ontologese it is true that there are simples arranged mountainwise in front of me, and this is all that is required for the ordinary English sentence 'There is a mountain in front of me' to be true. (18)

Elsewhere and passim he draws on the resources of the Buddhist tradition to identify as 'conventional truths' such sentences in ordinary English; and 'ultimate truths' the claims of Ontologese. In this, it would be good to see some acknowledgement of the failure of cognate (physicalist or phenomenalist) atomistic reductionisms over the last century or so. To consider the former: some oppose, but few now would dismiss, the idea that the Ultimate Constituents of the ontologies of the special sciences may be composed of only microphysical parts; but that is no statement of reductionism (if it were, 'non-reductive physicalism' would be a contradiction in terms, and we would have been spared an extended debate as to its prospects over the last half century[1]). A better question, as Fodor, Putnam, et al. suggested, is whether, say, 'tiger', or 'money', or 'death', or 'river', is/are predicates or kinds or types within even the science immediately lower than them, much less 'all the way down'. 'Mountain' is not a predicate of physics, and 'the river erodes its outer bank' is not a law of physics. If "there is a mountain in front of me" is conventionally true but Ultimately False, what makes it thus [conventionally] true? What makes said simples [whether quarks or sense-data or trial aspect monistic-yet-mine elements] into any 'arrangement' -- much less a mountainwise arrangement? Not the universe -- there are no mountainwise arrangements for the universe. One must assume ourselves, our interests, our projections, our 'conventions' (if you must) arrange said simples mountainwise for us. But then are we, our existences, interests, tendencies to project, to organize, to have such and such shape constancies and color constancies and object permanences and edge detectors and affordances Ultimately True? No! What holds this system together, given that first the mountains are eliminated and made into merely 'conventional truths' and then the selves and visual systems and tendencies to project and predicate are likewise?

Another issue concerns the microphysically smallest things (atoms? Quarks?) of the fundamental reducing science. Everyone but the most radical eliminativist acknowledges that there is the ontology of microphysics and there is an ontology of larger things that are probably/possibly/arguably composed of, or comprised by, these -- and there is thereby a problem (you could gloss it as an overdetermination or an exclusion or an epiphenomenalism problem, though its specific form will depend upon details of the view being defended and the concomitant set-up or 'problematic'). Has Benovsky done more than re-terminologize both of these things -- special sciences (conventional truths: everyday English) and fundamental science (Ultimate Truths: Ontologese)? Well, in light of his extraordinarily bold, novel, fundamental ontology (trial aspect theory), perhaps this is not a fair accusation -- but perhaps that in turn is not so much an asset as a burden. For note that for Benovsky a claim about the smallest things of physical science -- e.g. the specimen claim "there is an electron causing the streak in the cloud chamber" -- is Ultimately False (whatever our ultimate best physics says of the matter) and this not just because, really, when we no longer speak with the masses, there are only simples arranged cloudchamberwise in front of me, but because, really, when we no longer speak with the masses but in terms of his 'trial aspect theory', there are only simples arranged electronwise[2] also [or quarkwise, or whatever ultimatephysicswise]. An Ultimate Ontologese effecting an extreme reductionist connection with an extreme atomistic dual-aspect-plus-intentionality epistemology/psychology (invoked, it must be said, from the armchair) will reduce (wholly) the electrons and cloud-chamber alike. We have been down something like this route before, in early 20th century anti-metaphysical metaphysics and associated epistemology. Ask yourself how persuasive any independent (e.g. epistemological) arguments might be in its favor, say, as applied to electrons 92 years on; or, absent any such arguments, how persuasive arguments from [purely metaphysical] 'theoretical need' might be.

Benovsky deserves praise for the extent of his ambitions, the scope of this work, and his philosophical boldness. He is unafraid to do very sweeping aprioristic/armchair metaphysics, and unafraid to head in unfashionable and extremely rarefied directions. I think we need more of such big picture work in analytic philosophy. I would predict critical pressure is liable to be applied to his view in regard to the following:

  1. The need for any complete elimination to also, adequately, account for the appearances -- and all the appearances, not considered separately but together. His own treatment of the appearances is swift, dismissive -- but then again, this is a short book with a lot to do.
  2. The reflexive position of the eliminativist -- say, the vulnerability to transcendental argumentation.
  3. Explaining the predictive success and integration/structural-elegance/mathematical organization of both fundamental physics and the special sciences -- often brilliant, astonishing, success; and startling structural elegance, consilience and organization. How is it that our best, most predictive/explanatory/practically useful sciences, can be held to quantify over entities that are held, profoundly, radically, not to exist? This is a challenge for the physicalist reductionist vis-à-vis the special sciences; but Benovsky must take on this challenge from the special sciences and physics alike.
  4. The paradox of non-existence: How may one say of anything that it (what?) does not exist? The holistic (Ur) eliminativist tradition from Duhem to the Churchlands has an answer here -- whether adequate or not -- but this 'replaced framework' approach is wholly distinct from Benovsky's atomism (91).
  5. The complete abandonment of holism (emergentism), even (it appears) in epistemology and psychology -- pace, for example, the Gestalt and other psychological traditions, and in the teeth of very strong counter-arguments from these latter (arguments later appropriated by philosophers).
  6. Postulating from the armchair, to answer to entirely theoretical-metaphysical desiderata, a fundamental ontology (with, apparently, associated epistemic/psychological commitments) which is unlike anything seen as defensible in philosophy of science or epistemology or psychology for somewhere between 60-100 years.

I do not say Benovsky cannot meet these and other challenges to his position -- this is a review, not a critical notice. His is a short book on a big series of issues, defending a very ambitious position. I applaud his ambition.

[1] Benovsky is at least a little incautious about this (and perhaps something more) in a few places -- e.g. two places on page 95, one in which he speaks of dual aspect monism not 'embracing any kind of reduction, contrary to physicalism'.

[2] Puzzlingly, given his 'trial aspect' commitments, Benovsky nonetheless appears to embrace a 'special science vs fundamental physics' distinction when he constructs a vagueness argument to contrast 'is alive' with 'is an electron' to state "importantly, 'being alive' is not a property like, say, having positive charge. Having positive charge is a property we can find in the world, things have positive charge independently of us and we can find out about them. Being alive is a different affair" (73).