Emerson and Self-Culture

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John T. Lysaker, Emerson and Self-Culture, Indiana University Press, 2008, 226pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253219718.

Reviewed by Corey McCall, Elmira College


Until quite recently, philosophy departments have generally proven inhospitable ground for interpretations of the work of Ralph Waldo Emerson. With the exception of Classical American thinkers such as William James and John Dewey, few philosophers have acknowledged Emerson as a precursor, leaving him to their colleagues in Literature and American Studies Departments. With the eclipse of Pragmatism and the ascendancy of analytic philosophy in the middle of the twentieth century, Emerson was largely forgotten by philosophers.

While this situation largely remains unchanged, there are some nascent signs that philosophers are beginning to reconsider Emerson as a philosopher. Led by thinkers such as Stanley Cavell and Russell Goodman, philosophers are beginning to re-assess the significance of Emerson as a thinker.[1] Lysaker's book fits in this company, but the fit is an uncomfortable one. Unlike Cavell and Goodman, Lysaker presents a deeply personal response to Emerson through a series of close readings that center around the notion of self-culture in his work.[2] In this way, his reading is performative, for one of his stated tasks is to sound out the dimension of the personal in Emerson's corpus through a highly personal reading of various Emersonian texts. Lysaker's own accounting of his sustained reading of Emerson is often commendable and rewarding, but at the same time his book is certainly not one to recommend to scholars of philosophy who desire a basic overview of Emerson and his relevance for philosophy. This is certainly by design, for the Emerson we find in the pages of Lysaker's book is a living, breathing, complex individual that is clearly of deep consequence for Lysaker himself -- his book is by no means about Emerson in some distant, scholarly manner. Such overt enthusiasm brings its own risks. I shall return to both the risks taken by Lysaker in this book and the question of the potential audience for this book by way of conclusion. First, I offer a brief overview of the commendable aspects of Lysaker's interesting book.

As he writes at the outset of his book, Lysaker is interested in "taking Emerson personally."[3] For Lysaker, this means that the book will concern the various permutations of genius throughout Emerson's texts and the ways that Lysaker himself has taken up Emerson. Lysaker will thus serve as an enthusiastic albeit critical advocate for Emerson's work read through the lens of self-culture or Bildung.[4] The notion of the cultivation of the self anchors the book and allows Lysaker a way to chart in successive chapters the relations between the self and nature, the Divine, and society. Such a reading proves fruitful, as even a casual reader of Emerson realizes that the dynamics of self and society (in the form of the figure of self-reliance) and self and nature are of fundamental import to Emerson's work. More broadly, the modalities of necessity and possibility as well as inheritance and originality are at stake in Emerson's work as they are in any account of genius and self-culture, whether it be that of Kant, Foucault, or another thinker in this tradition: the key problematic for these thinkers concerns how we are to take what we're given, make sense of it, and transmute it into something qualitatively new, whether that something be an artwork, one's own life, or the daunting project of rendering one's life a work of art.

Something about all this talk of genius that both Kant and Foucault realized is that one can never become a genius simply by following a set of propositional rules, that is, one can never become a genius directly through inheritance. One of the tasks that Lysaker sets for himself in this book is to recommend Emerson as a key exemplar, along with the likes of Kant and Foucault, of this varied tradition that sees philosophy as the art of living.[5] Hence a basic question that any author who wants to recommend Emerson as a member of this tradition must answer at the outset is how Emerson fits into this tradition. Simultaneously, however, this author will have to determine how Emerson's genius differentiates itself from other voices in this tradition as Emerson finds his own voice through his writing. Emerson's texts present not a series of propositions but rather a series of provocations that record his own attempts to fashion himself and provoke his readers to attend to themselves in order to found through their eloquence their own place in the world.

Lysaker describes an eloquent life as

one that expresses a character in part self-fashioned through irreducibly personal labors like self-trust, commitment, perseverance, and so on. [Emerson's] work thus takes place outside the withered playing field of liberal atomism (which denies our relatedness or misconstrues it as contractual in nature); social construction (which leaves us mere functions of larger, impersonal events); and utilitarian collectivism, socialist or capitalist (which neglects the personal in favor of the illusory, unified subject of social engineering).[6]

This sets the stage for his reading of Emerson as a thinker who recommends self-culture without the fatal drawbacks of these (apparently) moribund traditions. Unlike liberalism, Emerson's texts construe our relationships with one another primarily in terms of friendship (recalling especially Aristotle's theory of friendship as well as that of Montaigne). Unlike structuralism and post-structuralism, Emerson's texts foreground the dimension of the personal without sacrificing our individual relatedness to one another and to the larger world. And unlike socialist and capitalist collectivism, Emerson's texts rehearse the relationship between the individual and society through the lens of reform.

Like other American thinkers that follow in his wake, Emerson sees individuals as always already involved in the process of living.[7] Borrowing a term from Heidegger, Lysaker construes this in terms of our "thrownness."[8] Self-culture involves navigating the complex relationship between inheritance (our thrownness) and originality (who we would like to be if we could but slough off what we perceive as pernicious influences of society). Emerson figures inheritance through the notions of involuntary perception and quotation. Involuntary perceptions are those "intuitions" (all other thoughts being tuitions that are based upon these primary intuitions) that reflection cannot work to undermine -- they can neither be argued for or against, as they are the touchstones upon which we form ourselves. Examples of involuntary perception cited by Lysaker include the idea that slavery is wrong, that a particular friend is trustworthy, or "the boorishness of zealots" (27). Further thoughts elaborate and unfold these initial intuitions, but they form the pre-reflective bedrock of the self. Later reflections upon these intuitions are activities engaged in by an individual as she articulates herself, while the initial intuitions seemingly strike us from out of nowhere and thus do not permit us the distance that reflection accomplishes.

Quotation, too, comes from without. Quotations are the influences that shape our character, ones that we take up and make our own. It is not simply a matter of citing texts, however. Rather, "quotation is an event of expression, one wherein the relations girding us appear in and through us" (36). Quotation designates our relatedness to one another and to the natural world, "the lines of exteriority running through our very interiority" (37). In recommending Emerson, Lysaker, like Cavell, wants to point out that Emersonian ethics is much more closely akin to ancient virtue ethics than it is to modern rule-based theories of moral action, for eloquence yields character. As it was for Aristotle, the human agent is embedded in a social and natural world expressed through quotation before she reflectively takes herself up as a project. Self-culture elaborates itself upon these impersonal grounds of personality and involuntary perception (37). We build upon them in developing a temperament and character that expresses our openness to the world along with the hope that we might change it for the better. For Emerson, this project is the work of genius.

Emersonian genius evinces dependencies in several registers at the same time that it attempts to exert its own temporary independence. The first of these is our dependence upon the natural world -- our thrown, embodied condition. Lysaker is much more suspicious of a second dependence, namely, our dependence upon the divine. It is at this point that Lysaker finds Emerson's writings most disquieting. Rather than a theodicy that would sacrifice the individual in the name of a divine power working ultimately for the good, Emerson's affinities with Nietzsche must be emphasized. Like Nietzsche, Lysaker finds the teleological and theological Emerson in need of revision. This Emerson who sees the tragic and evil as mere foils for the ultimate purpose of nature must be suppressed and alternatives urged. If Emerson is to remain relevant, his texts must be shorn of all pretensions to providence. Lysaker urges upon us the later, less assured Emerson of essays like "Fate," in which evil exists and progress or melioration only occurs as a result of our own hard work, the work of genius.

With or without God, our independence is only transitory; complete autonomy is never on the horizon. It is at this point that Lysaker discusses friendship and reform as two activities whereby the individual genius recommends herself to the wider world. In his discussion of friendship, Lysaker points to the strong parallels between Aristotle's discussion of friendship in Nicomachean Ethics and Emerson's own discussion. Lysaker focuses primarily on the essay "Friendship," but he also discusses Emerson's own friendship with Margaret Fuller, one that left her disillusioned and dissatisfied. According to Aristotle, ethical friendship occurs when we go beyond conceiving our relationship in instrumental terms and instead come to view it as a mutual relationship in which each friend works to improve the other, though not necessarily through kind words or good deeds. The ideal friend for Emerson is one who is "Janus-faced" (159). True friends do not simply accept us for who we are; instead, they provoke us to become better than we are. In short, true friends unsettle us so that we might better see prospects for self-culture that we might first have missed or perceived only faintly. It was precisely this that Margaret Fuller charged was missing in her friendship with Emerson, but according to Lysaker this only proves the difficulties inherent in this conception of friendship as an ideal.

The closest thing to a politics in Emerson centers around his idea of reform, the final dimension of self-culture. Reform is an extension of the dynamics of self-culture and friendship as it affects the broader social world. Accordingly, Emerson sees that reform is continuous with the private and local concerns characteristic of self-culture. Reform is the ultimate effect of a life lived in reflection and action, "the tendency of human lives to recreate the world in their fashion as they venture lives of more or less daring" (170). Through reform, we revive the world ("Genius is the activity which repairs the decay of things").[9] Reform marks the sociality of genius, but stops short of solidarity between all rational beings -- it remains personal. Politics implicates the genius and conditions her. The work of reform, through activities such as writing, protest, voting, and advocating, forces individuals to reflect on how they are implicated by the state and its policies. Additionally, such activities make individuals see how change becomes possible through the noble actions of genius. However, genius is fragile and contingent and its labor often for naught. Through his writings, Emerson stands as a testament both to the power and fragility of genius and to a life lived rightly without pre-ordained plan. Just as with Plato's Socrates, this might be the greatest lesson we can yet learn from him.

It should be apparent by now that this book is written in a profoundly Emersonian spirit, which means it is written in a spirit that refuses to back down from Emerson's provocations, nor does it proceed through attempts to domesticate his language. It represents a laudable attempt to think along with Emerson, and to recommend him as a companion with whom to think. It fails as a guide to Emerson's writings, but as a provocation to think along with him, it must be judged a success.

[1] Representative examples include Stanley Cavell, Emersonian Etudes (Palo Alto: Stanford University Press, 2001) and Russell Goodman, American Philosophy and The Romantic Tradition (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1993).

[2] One could certainly argue (rightly, I think) that Cavell's essays present a deeply personal account of his relationship to Emerson. However, at the same time he attempts to place Emerson within a philosophical tradition by mapping Emerson's affinities with the work of Wittgenstein, Heidegger, and others. Such an endeavor gets short shrift in Lysaker's work despite his acknowledged debt to Cavell; at the same time, this is not to say that this work is absent from Emerson and Self-Culture.

[3] This is the title of the first chapter of Lysaker's book.

[4] See Lysaker, p. 1: "In its widest scope, as far as I can see, turning in each direction, this work pursues Bildung, what I regard as a process of self-culture, a studied, even labored effort to cultivate one's life."

[5] The phrase belongs to Alexander Nehamas. In his The Art of Living: Socratic Reflections from Plato to Foucault (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1998), Nehamas examines various figures who have responded to Socrates as the key exemplar of philosophy as a way of life: Plato, Montaigne, Nietzsche, and Foucault. It is notable that this list includes one of Emerson's own models (Montaigne) as well as one who claimed Emerson as a model (Nietzsche).

[6] Lysaker, p. 7.

[7] Lysaker cites this passage from "The Over-Soul": "Man is a stream whose course is hidden. Our being is descending into us from we know not where" (cited on p. 27). The thinkers I have in mind here include James, Peirce, and of course Whitehead.

[8] On p. 27, Lysaker writes:

To use a Heideggerian idiom, the soul's action is "thrown" into conditions that envelop, delimit, and enable the project of self-culture. "I conceive of a man as always spoken to from behind and unable to turn his head and see the speaker," to return to Emerson. "In all the millions who have heard the voice, none ever saw the fact" (CW1, 129).

[9] Cited by Lysaker, p. 170.