Epistemic Dimensions of Personhood

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Simon J. Evnine, Epistemic Dimensions of Personhood, Oxford University Press, 2008, 176pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199239948.

Reviewed by Krista Lawlor, Stanford University


We know that belief and rationality are linked, but how? Does a logic of belief inform, or at the least constrain, principles of epistemic rationality? Does the nature of belief imply or necessitate substantive principles of epistemic rationality, such as Reflection or Conservatism? (Reflection is, very roughly, the claim that I should treat my future self as an expert; Conservatism is, still more roughly, the claim that I should treat my present self that way.[1]) Simon Evnine's book repositions these questions in terms of a link between rationality and persons. His stated aim in doing so is to defend a "traditional" conception of persons as essentially rational. Whether or not Evnine succeeds in his stated aim, he holds out the exciting prospect of getting new insight into substantive questions in the theory of epistemic rationality by repositioning those questions on a larger map.

Evnine begins with the claim that the concept of a person is the concept of a finite agent, located in space and time, a believer capable of second-order beliefs (chapter 1). From these features of personhood, Evnine argues for a host of claims about epistemic rationality: that persons have specific logical abilities, employing specific logical concepts (chapter 2); that persons' beliefs satisfy key principles in a logic of belief, especially closure under conjunction (chapters 3 and 4); that the nature of persons is such as to necessitate Reflection -- i.e. that one must treat one's future self as an expert (chapter 5); that Conservatism, while not defensible in light of a requirement of impartiality imposed by epistemic rationality, is nonetheless in some sense required of persons (chapter 6). Thus, finally, Evnine uncovers what he believes is a deep tension between being an impartial epistemic agent and being a person, a creature who, Evnine argues, is of necessity partial to her own viewpoint, which viewpoint is constituted by her own beliefs.

Evnine's book is in the main wonderfully clear, and offers detailed arguments about several central issues in the theory of epistemic rationality. It makes a nice entry point for readers new to the topics discussed. A short review cannot do justice to all the arguments in the book, so I highlight those I found most challenging.

I begin by stressing that Evnine's claims about what follows from personhood concern purported conceptual necessities -- so, for instance, having the concept of conjunction is both required for rationality and necessary for one to count as a person at all, according to Evnine. (The same goes for the concepts of disjunction, conditionality, negation, and quantification.) The argument for this surprising claim is that if one is an agent one must put information together, and putting information together requires that one has the concept of conjunction. Why conjunction specifically? Evnine's argument has three steps. Step 1: consider these introduction and elimination rules:

(1) Infer p from Conj (p,q)

(2) Infer q from Conj (p,q)

(3) Infer Conj (p,q) from p and q.

Suppose these rules are in some sense canonical for Conj. Step 2: show that "any creature meeting one of the necessary conditions of personhood must have a concept X for which [these rules] are canonical" (p. 29). Step 3: show that X has to be Conj as opposed to some other concept. How? Since the rules (1)-(3) are canonical for X, show also that they're valid (by a principle of Charity), and then claim that there can't be more than one concept with the same canonical and valid inference rules.

I see two immediate worries for this argument: The first is in the spirit of worries about rule-following -- who is to say whether one puts one's information together with conjunction or conjunction*, where conjunction* permits the synthesis of information, and is truth-functionally equivalent to conjunction, but for which distinct "bent rules" are canonical? Evnine considers this objection, and admits to having no knock-down argument against it:

The best answer I can give is this. The point of the synthesis is to keep an up-to-date integration of the information that a creature has. The way in which the synthesis is kept up to date is that, from the synthesis at any moment, and the acquisition of a new piece of information, a new synthesis is formed immediately on the basis of nothing other than those two elements. Thus, it is of the essence of how this synthesis is maintained that it be revisable according to (3). This would be strange unless the concept that united the elements of the synthesis were one for which (3) was canonical. (p. 35)

Of course, an appeal to the strangeness of a bent concept isn't of great help here. Evnine might give up the claim that specific logical concepts are required of agents, and retreat to the claim that at least some logical concepts are. But here a second worry arises. Simply to put information together in the service of agency doesn't require a concept of conjunction, or conjunction*, or any concept at all. When a fly lands on a surface, information in the visual system must be put together to determine features of the surface, so the fly's legs can go down when appropriate. The fly doesn't have to have the concept of conjunction to perform this feat of putting two and two together, though. It's not clear that being an agent per se requires having a concept of conjunction, or any logical concept at all.[2]

In chapters 3 and 4, Evnine argues that it is both rational and necessary if one is to count as a person that one satisfy the following principle of closure of belief under conjunction:

CPR1: If S rationally believes p and rationally believes q, then S rationally believes p and q.[3]

CPR1 has been implicated in generating Lottery and Preface paradoxes; both paradoxes purport to show that CPR1 is a problem because it has us believing contradictions. I haven't space to consider Evnine's response in full, so I focus on a single maneuver to exonerate CPR1 on which Evnine places a great deal of weight.[4] Evnine argues that in both the Lottery and Preface situations, removing the belief produced by CPR1 doesn't make matters any better, since one is still left with inconsistent beliefs. And since removing the contradictory belief produced by CPR1 doesn't leave one in a good place, it was some other epistemic defect that produced the unfortunate situation for the Lottery or Preface believer.

But this argument doesn't support the conclusion that conjunction is exonerated, since CPR1 might be argued to make a bad situation worse. And of course, in the Preface case, it's not at all clear whether the Preface believer is in a particularly bad epistemic situation, or whether she is in a fairly natural and tolerable epistemic situation, at least until CPR1 is applied.[5]

Chapter 3 also contains an argument that:

BC: Under normal circumstances, what it is to believe a conjunction simply is to believe its conjuncts.

Prima facie BC is implausible, since conjunction adds logical content, and so requires having and applying an additional logical concept. In defense of BC, Evnine argues that our attributional practices accord with BC. When we attribute a belief that p and a belief that q, we'll normally attribute a belief that p and q. But this just invites the question, When does our attribution of belief in conjunctions stop -- when are circumstances abnormal?

Chapter 4 answers this question. Evnine argues that in ascribing belief in the conjunction of one's beliefs, there's only one sort of abnormality to consider, wherein a person partitions her mental life. For Evnine partitioning is a psychological activity, aimed to shield one from inconsistency and the unpleasantness associated with it. Unless partitioning occurs, then, what it is to believe a conjunction simply is to believe its conjuncts.

We might wonder if there aren't other cases where our practice withholds the attribution of belief in a conjunction, distinct from cases of mental partitioning so characterized. To suppose that the only sort of partitioning is motivated partitioning, and that it"follows the fault lines" of a person's psychic life, is to do away with partitions created haphazardly, innocently, and remediably, because of natural limits on attention and memory. And yet we're all familiar with cases where we've failed to put two and two together -- Nick believes there's an extra coat on the rack in the hall, and believes Nora needs a coat, and yet Nick doesn't offer Nora a coat. Why? Easy explanations come to mind, and importantly, easy explanations that don't require evil intent, lack of desire to be helpful, etc. But if we are forced to say of Nick that he also believes the conjunction that there's an extra coat and that Nora needs a coat, then the set of our explanations of his failure to offer the coat seems to shrink to those that involve some such intent or desire, which of course is the wrong result. (This case presupposes a functional difference between belief in the conjuncts and a belief in their conjunction. But Evnine himself must recognize some functional difference here, too, or there'd be no reason to actively try to partition one's mental life to avoid belief in conjunctions.) My concern here is part of a larger concern, to which I think Evnine himself gives hints of being sensitive. Namely, attempts to demonstrate that of necessity a person's beliefs satisfy principles in a logic of belief will reliably stumble over the fact of our natural psychological limitations.[6]

In chapter 5 Evnine articulates an informal version of Bas van Frassen's General Reflection Principle:

Reflection: One should treat one's future selves as experts.

Evnine argues that it is both rational to satisfy Reflection, and necessary at least to some degree if one is to be a person. The argument for Reflection uses two premises: first, that our beliefs get better over time (Ameliorism), and second "that it's an essential feature of being a person that one have some knowledge of Ameliorism" (Self-knowledge) (p. 111). These two premises make Reflection rational to satisfy, since if one knows that the beliefs of one's future selves are by and large superior to those of one's current self, it is rational to treat those future selves as experts.

Evnine is quick to qualify what it means to treat one's future self as an expert: treating oneself as an expert means "if one comes to know what the expert believes and one does not come to know of any reason one should not, one would adopt that belief oneself." (p. 108 my emphasis)

This important qualification takes care of standard counter-examples to Reflection, e.g., Michael thinks he'll have ten drinks at the party, and that in his inebriated state will believe he can safely drive home; clearly it is not rational for him now to believe he can safely drive home. Evnine responds: Michael now knows a reason not to adopt the belief he knows his future self will have, since he knows his future belief will be formed when he is cognitively impaired. So the case is no counterexample.

Treat one's future self as an expert is a general, not universal, injunction, because there are cases where one should not treat one's future self as an expert. So what does Evnine's Reflection principle, understood as a general injunction, really tell us? It looks to impose a substantive requirement of diachronic coherence. But I wonder how substantive a claim it really makes. I have two broad questions here.

First, present reasonableness is a trumping consideration, in Evnine's modified principle. A negative evaluation of reasons given by one's current epistemic self gets to trump the evaluation of reasons by the future expert. Certainly that has the effect of diminishing the status of this expert. This all seems reasonable in itself, I should add. My only point is that it seems we have a substantial weakening of the original intent of Reflection, which was to state a bold demand for diachronic coherence simpliciter. The modified Reflection principle doesn't demand coherence come what may, but only coherence that doesn't come at the expense of synchronic reasonableness.

Second, the injunction Treat one's future self as an expert really only can make sense in company with other injunctions aimed at making oneself the sort of future self worth heeding. In the absence of these, there can be no rational demand for diachronic coherence, even with Evnine's significant qualification. Another way to put the point: Ameliorism implies that time's passing will alone make one's beliefs grow in quality and number, and while there's certainly some truth to that, what truth there is is not enough to make reasonable the treatment of my future selves as experts. More active work on my part, to make my future self worth heeding, is required before it would be rational to observe any injunction to heed my future self. For instance, while I have no specific positive reason to think a future self will make bad judgments about, say, complicated financial instruments, I do have reason to think I won't ever study up about these things. Unless I do something more to make my future self better understand personal finance, and know that I am doing more, I shouldn't expect my future self to be in any better position than my sorry present self in regard to these matters. Importantly here, I have now no specific reason to think that a future belief about stocks is false, or that "it doesn't result from proper cognitive functioning." Rather, I have a general reason to think my future self won't be an expert. We could try rewriting the qualification on Reflection, to the effect that "one not have reason to think one's future self no expert." The problem with this is that while it avoids the counterexample above, it does so at the cost of depriving the principle of most of its force.

Finally, in chapter 6, Evnine argues that there is a deep tension between being an impartial epistemic agent and being a person. Very roughly, the idea is this: A person is a believer, and has a viewpoint constituted by her beliefs. A person cannot help but be epistemically partial to her own viewpoint; and this partiality imposes a limit on the capacity of a person fully to satisfy the impartial demands of epistemic rationality.

One might have different reactions to the claim that persons can satisfy the demands of epistemic rationality only imperfectly if they are to be persons at all. On the one hand, it is perhaps not that surprising. We are accustomed to the idea that satisfying the demands of morality might put strains on us as persons, as creatures with specific relations to specific individuals. So one might say, this is just another case where this familiar sort of strain is felt. On the other hand, Evnine's claim puts positive pressure on a person -- one must prefer one's own viewpoint. More specifically, as Evnine sees it, as a person one is under an injunction to satisfy Conservatism -- one must treat one's present self as an expert, if one is a person at all. And this claim one might find surprising.

Evnine presents three cases that he thinks at least suggest some form of Conservatism. (Evnine here targets recent work of Christensen's.) In each case, Evnine argues that the demands of impartial epistemic rationality threaten the very identity or integrity of the person. The basic idea is that there is a limit to how fallible one can take oneself to be, and still be a believer at all. This is an intriguing idea, although the specific arguments in which it is applied seem more hastily constructed, and consequently more easily turned aside, than earlier arguments in the book. For instance, there's a very quick argument that one cannot take oneself as a counter-indicator on a wide scale. I confess I couldn't follow the argument, as it turns on the premise that "If one took one's believing that p as prima facie sufficient evidence that not-p over a wide range of propositions, the difference between what it is to believe p and what it is to believe not-p would be blurred" (p. 159). How exactly? Here as elsewhere in the chapter, the author seems in a hurry to make his points, at the expense of making them entirely convincing. The chapter does, however, contain the germs of several intriguing arguments, each worth pursuing.

Evnine's stated goal is not to reshape our understanding of epistemic rationality, but to defend a "traditional" conception of persons as rational in some fairly specific ways. In the end the book will likely not convince opponents of this conception, even if they grant its initial claims about the nature of persons. But the book does offer a highly readable exploration of just how far one can go toward that conception.

[1] See Richard Foley, The Theory of Epistemic Rationality, Harvard 1987, especially chapter 7, for discussion of Conservatism.

[2] Thanks to David Hills for discussion of this point.

[3] Evnine also notes an alternative principle CPR2: If S is rational, then if S believes p and believes q, then S believes p and q. In currently fashionable parlance, CPR1 gives narrow scope to "is rational" and CPR2 wide scope.

[4] See especially pp. 59 and 67 where Evnine calls it a "decisive" argument.

[5] See David Christensen (Putting Logic in its Place, Clarendon Press: Oxford, 2004) on the Preface paradox. He makes a compelling case that we are in preface style situations routinely.

[6] For interesting remarks about the nature of the difficulty, see Robert Stalnaker, "The Problem of Logical Omniscience, I", Synthese 89, 1991.