Epistemic Explanations: A Theory of Telic Normativity, and What it Explains

Epistemic Explanations

Ernest Sosa, Epistemic Explanations: A Theory of Telic Normativity, and What it Explains, Oxford University Press, 2021, 234pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198856467.

Reviewed by John Greco, Georgetown University


This book articulates and defends the latest version of Ernest Sosa’s distinctive virtue epistemology. Importantly, this new view both adds to and departs from earlier versions in various ways, resulting in what Sosa calls “a substantially improved telic virtue epistemology.” This new view, according to Sosa, “reconfigures earlier virtue epistemology,” which “now seems a first approximation” (xii). Expectations created by Sosa’s previous work will be extremely high, but the book does not disappoint—Sosa’s discussion is masterful. The book is full of ingenious arguments and acute insights that will occupy epistemologists for years to come.

Section 1 of this review articulates some central features of Sosa’s virtue epistemology that carry over to the new view. Section 2 highlights some new topics of discussion in the book. Section 3 considers some ways in which the new view departs from earlier versions. In particular, we consider the place of “default assumptions” in the new view—that is, assumptions that Sosa now thinks a) are required to be in place for knowledge, but b) need not be known themselves in order to play their epistemic role. Section 4 raises some questions for the view that results, including whether Sosa’s new category of default assumptions improves on earlier versions of virtue epistemology. My central concern regards the explanatory work that default assumptions are supposed to do in the new view, and whether they in fact add explanatory power to older versions of virtue epistemology.

What is retained? Some characteristic features of Sosa’s virtue epistemology.

The essential strategy of Sosa’s approach in the book is to understand epistemic normativity as a species of a broader telic normativity. The central idea is that “attempts” in general are directed to an end. An achievement, as opposed to a merely lucky success, attains that end “sufficiently through competence” (18). The present view retains some familiar machinery from Sosa for filling out this central idea.

First, it retains Sosa’s AAA-structure for understanding competent performance. Thus, an attempt is Accurate insofar as it attains success, as when an archer accurately hits their intended target. An attempt is Adroit insofar as it manifests competence, as when an archer shoots skillfully. Importantly, an attempt might be both accurate and adroit but not accurate because adroit. For example, an archer might skillfully shoot at an intended target, and successfully hit it as a result, but only because the arrow was blown off course by an unexpected wind, and then blown back on course by another. Juxtaposed to this kind of lucky success, an attempt is Apt when it is accurate because adroit, successful because competent (18).

Second, the present view retains Sosa’s SSS-structure for understanding competence, as well as varieties of competence. Thus, a competence might be understood as an innermost Skill seated in the agent, as when one embodies the requisite dispositions that go into good driving. But a more robust kind of competence includes being in appropriate Shape, as when a generally skilled driver is also awake and sober. Finally, an even more “complete competence” involves being in appropriate Situation as well, as when a good driver in good shape is also driving in good conditions, such as a sound road in good weather (19).

Another aspect of Sosa’s framework is a distinction between apt and “fully apt” performance.

We have seen how archery provides an example of a telic triple-A normativity constituted by our five main ideas, those of attempt, success, competence, aptness, and achievement. And our archery example also shows how achievement comes in degrees within at least two dimensions. One dimension is that of apt shot, accurate because adroit. The other dimension is that of the fully apt shot, where the agent aims not just at accuracy but at aptness, and succeeds through competence in this more complex endeavor. (20)

Full aptness is illustrated by Sosa’s example of Diana, who manifests first-order archery competence for hitting her target, but also second-order competence for shot selection. Accordingly, Diana’s shot is evaluable for higher quality when its success manifests not only her first-order competence, but her second-order competence as well. “When successfully enough guided in this way, an attempt rises to the level of fully apt. Nothing short of this will suffice for achievement full well” (21).

All of this is at the level of a general theory of telic normativity, and applied by Sosa to the specific case of epistemic normativity as well. The central idea here is that knowledge is a kind of achievement, a kind of success owing to competence rather than luck. (17–18) Moreover, cognitive performance can be understood in terms of the same AAA structure, and cognitive competence can be understood in terms of the same SSS structure. Likewise, we may distinguish a low-grade knowledge constituted by apt cognitive performance on the first order; that is, belief that is true because competent. And we can distinguish a higher grade of knowledge—knowledge full well—constituted by apt performance aptly guided.

This brings us to another feature of Sosa’s account that carries over from earlier versions. That is, his distinction between alethic affirmation, understood as an “endeavor (attempt) to get it right by affirming that p,” and judgment, understood as an “endeavor (attempt) to get it right aptly by alethically affirming that p” (24). Mere alethic affirmation is illustrated by the quiz show contestant, who aims to answer correctly, even though merely guessing. Judgment is illustrated by the expert oncologist, who aims not just to get things right, but to get things right through relevant competence (24–5).

Some new discussions.

By way of new material, chapter one defends the importance of “firsthand intuitive insight”—a kind of understanding that is characteristic of the humanities—and offers a virtue-theoretic account of its normative standing and value. From that same virtue-theoretic perspective, chapter two articulates a distinction between “gnoseology,” or the theory of knowledge proper, and a broader intellectual ethics. The central claim here is that gnoseology “is a domain of assessment that is sealed against practical incursions” (40). Consistent with that, pragmatic and moral factors do bear on other considerations relevant to intellectual ethics, such as what questions to pursue, and when to end inquiry (42–3).

Part Two of the book (four chapters) develops Sosa’s account of the suspension of judgment. The central idea here is that judgment aims to affirm not only correctly, but aptly; that is, “to affirm alethically on the given question (positively or negatively) if and only if one’s alethic affirmation would be competent and indeed apt” (50). This, in turn, entails that judging and suspending “share an aim: to judge if and only if one would judge with success” (50–51). Proper suspension of judgment is to be understood in relation to that aim, thereby bringing the normativity of suspension within a broader telic normativity. Also of note in Part Two is a new objection to evidentialism, which Sosa argues cannot adequately explain epistemic negligence and recklessness, two phenomena that “bear on epistemically justified suspension of judgment” (57).

Sosa uses similar arguments to bring inquiry within the sphere of telic normativity: “inquiry is thus a special case of consciously intentional goal-directed action.” Specifically, “Our aim as we inquire . . . is to affirm alethically and aptly the right answer to our question whether p” (88). Finally, the book closes with an interesting take on Wittgenstein’s On Certainty, and in particular Wittgenstein’s dispute with Moore in that work.

What has changed? Some departures from Sosa’s earlier views.

As indicated above, Sosa’s approach implies a variety of grades of knowledge. In previous versions, Sosa distinguished between animal knowledge, reflective knowledge, and knowing full well. The new view reinterprets these categories and adds a category of “secure knowledge.” Secure knowledge is knowledge where one’s relevant competencies are securely in place (186).

The older categories are now reinterpreted, owing to Sosa’s distinction between alethic affirmation and judgement.[1] Animal knowledge is now apt alethic affirmation: that is, alethic affirmation that is owing to first-order cognitive competence. Knowledge full well is now apt judgment; that is, apt alethic affirmation that is guided by second-order cognitive competence. Reflective knowledge—apt alethic affirmation that is aptly represented as such—is now a component of knowledge full well, which adds a guidance component. Accordingly, Sosa often refers to knowledge full well as “reflective knowledge full well” (e.g., 138, 142–3, 186).

Sosa now adds secure knowledge to these older categories. This kind of knowledge comes into view when we consider scenarios where one’s relevant competencies are in place, but in a way that is modally unstable. For example, consider the case of Simone, an ace fighter pilot who is routinely subject to testing under simulation. The twist is that Simone is “in the dark” about this—when operating in a flight simulator, she takes herself to be in a genuine cockpit, flying a real mission (169). Suppose now that Simone is indeed flying a real mission. In this scenario, Sosa now argues, Simone’s complete first-order competencies are actually in place, as are her complete second-order competencies that guide them. But Simone’s being in an appropriate Situation is modally unstable, since she could easily be in a simulation. Moreover, if she were in a simulation, she would continue to judge that she is not. Sosa reasons that, in such a case, Simone continues to have knowledge, and even knowledge full well. But Simone’s epistemic success is still subject to a kind of luck—she is lucky to have the competencies in place that underwrite her knowing full well. Hence the category of secure knowledge, which explains what Simone lacks, but that others enjoy in normal modal environments. “Security has been given a place in our metaphysics of epistemology, so as to explain why it is that our Simone would not really know if she might so easily have been under simulation. What she would lack is a demanding sort of knowledge, secure knowledge full well” (174).

Finally, we arrive at the starkest change in Sosa’s view—the introduction of the new category of “default assumptions” into his virtue epistemology. Such assumptions, Sosa argues, are required to be in place for several important kinds of knowledge. Importantly, however, such assumptions are mere assumptions—they need not be known themselves in order to play their epistemic role.

In keeping with his telic approach, Sosa argues that default assumptions have their place in the evaluation of human attempts more generally. Their role in epistemic evaluation can be understood as a special instance of a broader normative phenomena.

The success of an attempt is creditable only if sufficiently owed to the agent’s pertinent triple-S competence. In managing their performances, athletes must heed their level of skill, along with how tired they are, how far from the target, and so on, for the various skill, shape and situation factors that are known to affect performance. Still, many factors they can properly ignore, as they are in the “background” [. . . .] As an athlete, one is not negligent for ignoring such factors, with a default assumption that they are of no concern, absent indication to the contrary [. . . .] As for the relevant “background conditions,” one need only assume that they are in place” (124)

According to Sosa, “background conditions come in three sorts, corresponding to the triple-S structure of competence” (125). Background conditions are conditions that are entailed by the relevant triple-S structure being in place. Default assumptions are assumptions that such background conditions are in place.

A background condition is one that must hold if the relevant S factor is to be in place at the time of performance. The presence of the pertinent skill, shape, or situation will thus entail respective background conditions. What puts such conditions in the background is that, although they must hold, you can perform fully aptly without knowing that they hold. Nor need they hold safely if your performance is to be apt. (125)

Good lighting conditions for athletic performance illustrates the idea. The fielder who attempts a catch within the parameters of her triple-S competence gets full credit for her success, even if the good lighting required for proper Situation is modally unstable (not safely in place), and even if the athlete has no awareness of this. The “merely modal” fact that the lights might go out does not affect the quality of the athlete’s performance, precisely because good lighting can be properly assumed in the domain of athletic performance. Sosa generalizes on this idea, arguing that epistemic attempts and performances likewise take place within the context of proper default assumptions, now regarding the background conditions that are relevant to the epistemic domain.

Sosa argues that, among other things, his introduction of default assumptions enables a new response to radical skepticism, one “independent of the modal remoteness shared by many skeptical scenarios.”

Consider again the quality of an athlete’s performance and the credit for its success. As noted, imminent background danger might have zero bearing on either quality of performance or credit for success. Nor need the agent rule out all such danger, some of which may be “irrelevant.”

Analogously, epistemic agents may not be required to rule out irrelevant skeptical alternatives, apart from assuming that no such danger will be realized in fact. (126)

In our framework, an alternative is relevant if and only if it is one that needs to be ruled out specifically (either through explicit judgment or through implicit belief), as its absence cannot be taken for granted by default. That notion applies pervasively in human life, and to epistemic performance as a special case. (127)

In the next and final section, I raise some questions for Sosa’s new view.

 Some questions about the new view.

First, Sosa defends a “metaphysical hierarchy” of categories of knowledge. (xii, 185) How is this hierarchy related to the concept of knowledge in use in our ordinary language and practices of epistemic evaluation? For example, is human knowledge typically knowledge full well, with its requisite second-order components? Specifically, does human knowledge typically involve judgment, with its constitutive second-order aiming, i.e., aiming at first-order aptness? Much of Sosa’s text suggest that he believes the answer is yes. For example,

A desirable level of human knowledge is apt judgment, the fully apt alethic affirmation. (53)

mere animal knowledge thus falls below the reflective knowledge familiar to normal humans over a vast domain wherein we judge, share information, and coordinate action, through our remarkable ability to communicate. (54)[2]

But how plausible is it that human knowledge typically involves such second-order aiming? A related question regards how and when judgmental knowledge comes into place. On Sosa’s earlier view, human knowledge begins with animal knowledge. Reflective knowledge comes into existence as a second-order perspective is built out of earlier animal knowledge, presumably gradually and by degree. Importantly, however, both animal knowledge and reflective knowledge had the same aim—believing the truth. What reflective knowledge added was an apt perspective on that first-order aptness. What knowledge full well added was guidance by that second-order perspective. Does a different view, which sees human knowledge as typically judgmental knowledge, allow for this same answer to the question? Not clearly, insofar as judgmental knowledge now involves a second-order aiming as well as a second-order perspective. When and how does that more complicated aiming come into place?

Finally, I want to raise a question about the explanatory power of the new view. In particular, how does the category of default assumptions add to the explanatory power of previous versions of virtue epistemology? I want to argue that it does not, or at least not clearly so.

In this regard, we need to make a distinction that Sosa often glosses over in the book. That is, we need to distinguish between a) requiring default assumptions for various grades of knowledge, and b) allowing default assumptions for those grades. In effect, this is the distinction between a) the claim that knowledge requires default assumptions that relevant background conditions are in place, and b) the claim that knowledge does not require that relevant background conditions are known to be in place, nor that they are safely in place. The point I want to make here is that virtue epistemology has always endorsed the second claim. Accordingly, Sosa is departing from previous virtue epistemology only if he is understood as making the first claim. But now our question arises: What explanatory work does the first claim do, over and above the second claim?

My space is limited, so I will consider only two places in the book where default assumptions are supposed to do explanatory work. First, return to Sosa’s new response to radical skepticism. Sosa summarizes as follows:

An initial response to our skeptic is that they’ve mistaken what’s required for the epistemic quality of our ordinary judgments and beliefs. Their mistake is like disparaging a superb baseball catch as due to discrediting luck because, unknown to the fielder, the lights could have so easily failed. (126)

In other words, the skeptic’s mistake is to think that background conditions must be known to be in place, or even known to be safely in place. But this response requires only the weaker virtue-theoretic claim discussed above: that knowledge does not require that relevant background conditions are known to be in place, nor that they are safely in place. This general strategy does not invoke a requirement of default assumptions at all.

In similar fashion, Sosa invokes the idea of default assumptions to explain how it is that we can know, even know full well, despite close modal danger. In this regard, he imagines a scenario where all is actually well, but where we are in close danger of being placed en masse in a Matrix setting by a nearby alien force. Imagine that our fate is decided, in our favor, by a coin flip. Sosa’s intuition is that we do not, in such a case, thereby lose our massive store of collective knowledge. His explanation of why this is so again invokes the idea that, despite close modal danger, our relevant competencies would remain in place. This includes relevant first-order competencies, but also relevant second-order competence that we use to assess and guide our first-order position. That is because these competencies, too, operate on their own default assumptions.

Within a virtue theoretic framework we can then still judge and believe with full aptness. The “fullness” of our aptness is constituted by two things in combination: (a) the aptness of our success, as this manifests not just luck but sufficient competence exercised by the agent, and (b) the aptness of that apt attainment, as this aptness is itself attained through the agent’s competent assessment that they’re then positioned to attain it [. . . .] Their attempt may thus be apt, and “fully” apt, even while neglecting factors with negligible bearing. (132)

But note again, nothing in this explanation invokes a requirement of default assumptions on knowledge. The explanatory work is being done by the idea that full aptness is attained by exercising requisite competencies, and that this is consistent with “neglecting factors with negligible bearing.” But again, that idea is already contained in the weaker claim distinguished above.

 Sosa calls his response to radical skepticism an “initial response,” because it must be supplemented with an appeal to secure knowledge, to come later in Chapter 9 (127, n. 6). The idea here is that, threatened with the close modal possibility of a radical skeptical scenario, we might continue to enjoy knowledge full well, but nevertheless lack a higher grade of knowledge, secure knowledge. As with the case of Simone, this explains our intuition that we don’t “really know” when so threatened. But once again, Sosa’s category of secure knowledge need not invoke any requirement of default assumptions. Rather, the essential idea is that relevant background conditions, and so relevant competencies, are safely in place.

Sosa would no doubt argue that there are other benefits to his new approach, ones that presumably outweigh the theoretical costs of requiring default assumptions across broad domains of human activity, including the epistemic. Accordingly, for all I have said here, it remains an open question whether Sosa’s new view improves on earlier versions of virtue epistemology, including Sosa’s own. There is no open question about the value of Sosa’s book, however. Sosa has once again succeeded in changing the terms of contemporary epistemology, while at the same time raising the bar on quality and depth of insight.


[1] This reinterpretation begins with Judgment and Agency (Oxford University Press, 2015).

[2] Also relevant here is Sosa’s comparison of animal knowledge to guessing on an eye exam (54).