Epistemic Norms: New Essays on Action, Belief, and Assertion

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Clayton Littlejohn and John Turri (eds.), Epistemic Norms: New Essays on Action, Belief, and Assertion, Oxford University Press, 2014, 262pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199660025.

Reviewed by Conor McHugh, University of Southampton


You shouldn't believe what your horoscope says. Nor should you act on or assert what it says. These look like normative epistemic assessments of belief, action and assertion. Recent years have seen an explosion of interest in epistemic normativity. This volume brings together thirteen essays, twelve of them new, and an introduction, from leading figures in the area. They indicate the impressive variety of work currently being conducted under the heading of epistemic normativity, and include some valuable contributions to ongoing debates.

The times weren't always so good for epistemic normativity. For years, epistemologists focused their efforts primarily on analysing knowledge and on the internalism-externalism debates. While the normative aspects of these issues were acknowledged by many, and analogies with ethics were explicitly made by some, the study of epistemic normativity as such, conceived as an instance of the broader, domain-transcendent phenomenon of normativity, was not widely seen as central to epistemology.

At the same time, a sharp distinction tended to be observed between the epistemic and practical domains. Epistemic norms, when recognised, were typically taken to govern beliefs and theoretical reasoning. Our lives as agents, on the other hand, were taken to be governed by very different, practical norms.

Various developments have contributed to the rise of epistemic normativity. Epistemology's value turn saw an increasing interest in the normative character of epistemic evaluation of beliefs. This interest in the norms of belief led epistemologists to pay more attention to connections with other domains in which norms play a role, and the lessons they could learn from philosophical work in those domains.

The assimilation of the epistemic-practical distinction and the belief-action distinction was undermined by a new emphasis on the idea that actions might be governed by distinctively epistemic norms. Timothy Williamson's discussion of the norms of assertion (2000), while not the first, was seminal. He argued that the speech-act of assertion is constituted by a norm of knowledge: a non-knowledgeable assertion is defective qua assertion, regardless of how well it serves the good or any other practical aims. Much subsequent debate has taken for granted that there is an epistemic norm proper to assertion, and focused on the question what the content of that norm is. This is perhaps unsurprising, given that assertion is naturally thought of as a kind of external analogue of judgment, the mental event of belief-formation.

A third relevant development has been a better appreciation of the significance of belief's inextricable connections to action, and in particular of the role of belief in practical reasoning and acting for reasons. The reasons for which we act are given by the contents of our beliefs. Deploying a content in this way -- treating it as a reason -- will be criticisable if the belief whose content it is lacks appropriate epistemic credentials. Thus, not only specific kinds of actions such as assertion, but also acting for a reason as such, seem to be subject to epistemic norms.

Finally, ethicists' increasing focus on notions such as reasons and rationality, which clearly apply as well to belief as to action, made evident that epistemology can profit from paying attention to the general normative categories under which some of its central notions fall.

In the context of these trends, the present collection is timely.

Although the volume's subtitle suggests three distinguishable themes, the editors have elected not to group the contributions thematically. Instead, they are presented in alphabetical order by author. This is understandable. Not all of the essays fall clearly or uniquely under one of the three themes mentioned in the subtitle. Any grouping by theme will be somewhat arbitrary, and risks obscuring some of the interconnections between the contributions. On the other hand, such a grouping can also highlight some of those interconnections. The alphabetical presentation leaves the reader with some work to do in identifying them.

Clayton Littlejohn's introduction does not provide a great deal of explicit guidance in this respect, instead plunging into the question of whether assertion, belief and practical reasoning are subject to a knowledge norm. However, his clear and very interesting discussion does illustrate some benefits of considering these three categories together, and it presages many of the specific issues addressed in the subsequent essays.

Rather than trying to critically discuss all of the essays, I will give a survey punctuated with a few comments on essays where deep general issues come out. This in no way implies that the other essays are less worthy of discussion. The volume contains many very interesting ideas and arguments. Space permits me to address only a few, and then very briefly.

For my purposes, and despite the subtitle, the essays can be roughly grouped under four themes. The contributions of E. J. Coffman, Duncan Pritchard, and John Turri fall squarely within the debate on the norms of assertion. Coffman and Pritchard defend alternatives to the popular knowledge account, while Turri responds to a prominent objection to that account. Coffman defends the view that the standard for epistemically permissible assertion is 'would-be-knowledge': a belief that would constitute knowledge were the subject's environment "considerably friendlier relative to" that belief (38). An environment is friendly relative to a belief to the extent that, in that environment, the subject is disposed to believe truths rather than falsehoods about the belief's subject matter. Pritchard defends a safety account, a safe assertion being one that is not only true, but is made on a basis that could not easily have issued in a false assertion (161). Having argued that this account best satisfies a range of intuitions and data, he suggests a deeper theoretical rationale for it, appealing to our desire for assertions on which we can rely without incurring epistemic risk.

Jennifer Lackey's well known "selfless assertion" cases (2007) come up in both of these contributions. These are cases in which an individual asserts something that she does not believe despite being aware of justifying evidence for it. For example, a doctor tells a child's parents, on the basis of strong supporting evidence, that there is no link between vaccines and autism, even though he does not believe this due to the emotional trauma of his daughter's autism diagnosis. In some such cases there is said to be an intuition of epistemic propriety, contrary to what the knowledge account would predict given that knowledge requires belief.

Pritchard deploys this objection to the knowledge account; Coffman argues that it fails. It is the main focus of Turri's essay. Turri argues that Lackey's examples of selfless assertion can be rejected, and that any force our supposed intuitions about them have is outweighed by a battery of evidence on the other side. This concise essay demonstrates the need for care when appealing to intuitions about complex examples.

The second group of contributions comprises those of Juan Comesaña and Matthew McGrath, Jonathan Dancy, and Clayton Littlejohn. They all address the theme of (broadly) epistemic constraints on practical reasons -- though they are not all primarily concerned with the same kinds of reasons.

Comesaña and McGrath argue against the view that what they call "reasons-had" -- roughly, considerations that can make a difference to the substantive rationality of your actions -- must be facts. Along the way they make and defend some other, arguably more controversial, claims, notably the claim that emotion operators like 'S is glad that' are not factive, and the claim that motivating reasons need not be facts. Defending this last claim is the main aim of Dancy's essay. The claim faces a challenge from the connection between motivating reasons and explanation, combined with the fact that the explanans of a correct explanation must be true. Dancy's solution is subtle: he accepts that, when we give the reason for which you acted, we explain your action, but he denies that the reason for which you acted need itself be the explanans. What explains your action may instead be that you did it for that reason.

Littlejohn's essay concerns not only motivating, but also normative reasons. He argues that your practical obligations are not determined by your evidence, and takes this to support a knowledge norm on practical reason: you should treat as a practical reason (and indeed believe) only what you know. The argument contains many moving parts and touches in interesting ways on a wide range of issues. At the heart of it are two assumptions. One is that the norms governing practical reason and belief coincide. What can be permissibly believed can be permissibly treated as a reason. The second assumption is that your obligations are determined by what you can permissibly treat as a reason. At any rate, this assumption seems to be required in order for the claim that your obligations are not determined by your evidence to support any particular norm on practical reason.

I wonder if there is a tension between this second assumption and the knowledge norm, given other claims Littlejohn wants to make. Suppose that the glass you give your friend contains petrol instead of gin, despite all your evidence to the contrary. You don't know that the contents of the glass are safe to drink. So this consideration cannot, it seems, be permissibly treated as a reason to give your friend the glass. But nor do you know that the contents of the glass are not safe. So this consideration, it seems, cannot be permissibly treated as a reason not to give your friend the glass. It's not clear to me why what little you do know in this situation couldn't favour giving your friend the glass. If we want to say that "it's wrong to poison your friends and lovers" (139) regardless of your evidence, we seem forced to say that even unknown and unknowable facts can make a difference to your obligations. But then, either what's permissibly treated as a reason is not only what's known, or your obligations are not determined by what's permissibly treated as a reason -- not all normative reasons are permissibly treated as such.

The essays by John Gibbons, Ernest Sosa, and Daniel Whiting focus on the norms governing belief. Gibbons argues that belief is subject to a norm of knowledge, rather than merely truth (or justification). Readers of Gibbons's The Norm of Belief (2013), reviewed previously in this journal, will recognise this as an abridged version of Chapter 8 of that book. Sosa's essay constitutes an argument for the importance of a form of reflective, "judgmental" belief, which he conceives as a disposition to perform the free, intentional action of affirmation. It is a characteristically rich and original contribution from arguably the single most important recent thinker on epistemic normativity, albeit one that is relatively detached from the literature that the volume as a whole largely responds to and aims to advance.

Whiting's contribution gives a particularly nice illustration of how thinking about belief and action together can help to shed light on both. Its aim is to explain the apparent (though not universally accepted) fact that subjects do not take practical considerations to be reasons that can justify belief. It is popular to claim that belief 'aims' at truth, but, even if this is so, we have other aims, too, and sometimes believing things for which we lack evidence might serve them. Whiting's suggestion is that "the aim of belief is dictated by practical reason itself" (227, emphasis in original). Belief, he claims, aims in the first instance to provide premises for practical reasoning. But as agents we aim to be guided in our practical reasoning only by facts. Therefore, in aiming to provide premises for practical reasoning, belief aims at truth. And, crucially, this aim cannot be overridden by particular practical aims, since it derives from the general practical aim constitutive of agency.

Whiting effectively deals with a number of objections. Still, one might question whether he succeeds in fully explaining the phenomenon. Suppose that believing p would serve some particular practical aim of yours, and that you also have evidence for p. In this case your particular practical aim does not conflict with the aim of truth, so there is no question of the aim of truth being overridden. Why, then, couldn't this particular practical aim generate reasons that add to the justification provided by the evidence for p?

However that may be, Whiting's development of the idea that evidentialist norms have their source in belief's contribution to our practical lives is very attractive.

Finally, a number of the essays take a broader perspective, offering approaches to epistemic normativity in general, its nature and structure. The essays by Jonathan Kvanvig, Matt Weiner, Berit Brogaard and Sarah Wright fall under this heading.

Kvanvig and Weiner both focus on norms governing belief. They both hold that there are many such norms, and offer abstract, schematic accounts of how they hang together. However, there are deep differences between their views. For Kvanvig, the norms of belief are hierarchically organised and obey a kind of perspectivism, or internalism broadly construed. The motivation for this runs deep: a normative theory should do justice to our "egocentric predicament" in wondering what to think, and this requires the norms it posits to be "cognition-guiding" (124). Objectivists such as Littlejohn will reject this approach, holding that epistemic norms simply permit or forbid conduct, and need not be guiding.

Weiner is with the objectivists on this score, but his approach is pluralistic. On his view, there are two epistemic ideals, a "thin" (true belief) and a "thick" (understanding everything). Each sits at the extreme end of a "spectrum" of norms. As we move down the spectrum, the norms get less ideal: they take into account more and more of the subject's evidential and cognitive limitations, and recommend the conduct that "produces the most epistemic good within those limitations" (205). These less ideal norms might be able to guide us, but there is nothing about normativity that requires this: no particular point on the spectrum gives the unique correct answer to the question what the subject ought to believe.

Brogaard's and Wright's contributions both draw on ancient ideas to cast fresh light on these contemporary debates. Brogaard defends the unorthodox view that the fundamental epistemic norm governing belief, assertion and action is intellectual flourishing, understood as a kind of epistemic eudaimonia. Wright defends a virtue-theoretic account of the epistemic norms governing belief and assertion. Departing from the mainstream of contemporary virtue epistemology, which has largely untethered itself from its historical roots, Wright brings to bear a serious engagement with ancient virtue theory. Central to her account is the Stoics' distinction between the telos, or final end, of a skill, and the skopos, or local target, of a particular exercise of the skill. Wright suggests that true belief is a skopos -- something we aim at when, say, forming a particular belief. The telos of our epistemic lives, however, is to believe in accordance with the intellectual virtues. In a subtle and illuminating discussion, Wright shows how this approach can capture our patterns of normative epistemic assessment to an impressive degree. This essay provides a satisfying, challenging close to the book, illustrating how, when discussing contemporary issues, a historically informed approach can often be a remarkably fresh one. Anyone interested in epistemic normativity, or in normativity more generally, will be stimulated and informed by it, as they will by this volume as a whole.

Thanks to Kurt Sylvan and Daniel Whiting for helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review.

Gibbons, John (2013). The Norm of Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lackey, Jennifer (2007). "Norms of Assertion". Noûs 41: 594-623.

Williamson, Timothy (2000). Knowledge and its Limits. Oxford: Oxford University Press.