Epistemic Reasoning and the Mental

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Mikkel Gerken, Epistemic Reasoning and the Mental, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 340pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137025517.

Reviewed by B. J. C. Madison, United Arab Emirates University


Looking around me, I am warranted in believing that I live in the desert. Reflecting on a bit of geography, I am also warranted in believing that all deserts are extremely dry. From these two warranted beliefs, I am able to competently deduce the further warranted belief that I live somewhere extremely dry. This example illustrates the commonplace that from warranted beliefs, deductive reasoning can, in certain circumstances, extend our warrant to believe further things. But under just what conditions can deductive reasoning yield warranted beliefs? In general, what epistemic principles govern warrant by reasoning? It is these central questions that occupy Mikkel Gerken in his excellent book.

To begin with, what is refreshing is Gerken's proposed methodology: he aims to pursue questions in the epistemology of reasoning by attending to debates in both the philosophy of mind and epistemology. Pursuing central questions in epistemology without paying attention to how these issues relate to debates in the philosophy of mind, and vice versa, is unfortunately all too common in the contemporary debate, and Gerken is to be commended for his approach. He displays obvious mastery of both the philosophy of mind and epistemology, and his treatment is extremely thorough.

The thoroughness, however, has pros and cons. This book appears in Palgrave Innovations in Philosophy which is intended to be a series of short monographs on hot topics in contemporary philosophy. At 340 pages, Gerken's book might have benefited from being somewhat abbreviated, especially in sections which primarily conduct critical literature surveys. For example, chapter 2 is an 82 page attempt to characterize the competences involved in deductive reasoning, much of which in the end is either taken as primitive, or else is accepted for the sake of argument. People familiar with much of this material might feel the need to skip ahead. On the other hand, the extended critical literature surveys could prove useful for teaching purposes. For example, chapter 3 acts as an introduction to anti-individualism about the mental, and chapter 4 serves as a nice survey of the so-called slow-switch literature (which concerns a variation of Twin-Earth thought experiments that are also taken to reveal things about the nature of mental content and the individuation of mental states).

Gerken's central thesis is bold and novel, and to my mind convincingly argued for. The book presents an extended argument against the following principle:

Validity Requirement: purportedly deductive reasoning from warranted premises yields warrant for a conclusion only if the reasoning is valid.

Warrant here is taken to be a general notion of epistemic rationality that is non-factive. If Gerken's arguments are successful, invalid arguments can sometimes generate warrant for a conclusion.

The background to the argument is Gerken's spirited defense of anti-individualism about the mental: following Putnam, Burge, and others, Gerken argues that mental representation types are not individuated entirely by factors internal to the subject, but constitutively depend upon relations that the subject bears to his physical and social environment. As Twin-Earth style thought experiments are taken to show, what thought-types a subject has depends on his environment. Whereas on earth a subject can have beliefs about apples, for example, his individualistically specified qualitatively identical counterpart on Twin-Earth does not have beliefs about apples, but rather, has type-distinct beliefs about twin-apples.

With the assumption of anti-individualism about the mental in place, which Gerken defends extensively in chapter 3, we can get a prima facie sense of Gerken's case against the Validity Requirement by considering one of his central examples. In the example, a subject, Peter, has acquired the concept appleE here on Earth in the usual ways, and he retains in memory his belief that some apples are red. Peter is subsequently transported to Twin-Earth, a place that we can suppose is subjectively indistinguishable from Earth, except that there are no apples, but a distinct fruit, which an earthling would easily confuse for apples. Given anti-individualism about the mental, however, after some time Peter would acquire the belief with the following content: all applesTE are sweet. Assuming that applesE and applesTE are different concepts, then Peter equivocates when he engages in the following reasoning:

Peter's Apple Argument:

(Apple 1): Some applesE are red.

(Apple 2): All applesTE are sweet.

(Apple 3): Something is both red and sweet. (p. 87)

Assuming that the beliefs about fruit expressed in (Apple 1) and (Apple 2) are different types, then Peter's reasoning is invalid: given the purportedly deductive reasoning used, the truth of the premises do not entail the truth of the conclusion. Nevertheless, as Gerken argues throughout the book, plausibly Peter is warranted in believing that something is both red and sweet on the basis of the above argument. If so, then the Validity Requirement is false.

Rather than simply reject the Validity Requirement, Gerken offers positive proposals that are meant to replace it in subsequent chapters (particularly chapter 6). Instead of Validity Requirement, Gerken offers Legitimacy Requirement: "S's (purportedly deductive) reasoning, R, from warranted premise-beliefs provides (conditional) warrant for S's belief in its conclusion only if R is epistemically legitimate" (p. 305). Epistemically legitimate reasoning, in turn, is defined thus: "Legitimate Reasoning: S's reasoning, R, is epistemically legitimate iff R is constituted by S's exercise of a safe reasoning-competence." (p. 305) A reasoning competence being safe is understood in terms of an elusive notion of epistemically normal environments: "Safety of Reasoning Competence: S exercises a safe reasoning-competence iff (if the relevant epistemic circumstances were normal and S exercised the same reasoning-competence, then S would have reasoned validly)" (p. 296). In short, the idea is that the purportedly deductive reasoning does not need to be actually valid to warrant a conclusion, but only requires that it would be valid, had things been epistemically normal.

It proves extremely difficult to characterize what makes an environment an epistemically normal one. Gerken rejects Burge's idea that the epistemcially normal environment is the same as the environment which plays the state-individuating role, but he does suggest that reference to such environments is still a necessary condition on spelling out normal environments: "S is in general epistemically normal circumstances only if S is in her normal environment" (p. 319). The monograph ends in an exploratory spirit, considering different possible directions the results of the book might be extended and developed.

Critical Discussion

Since I by and large agree with Gerken's negative arguments against the Validity Requirement, I shall focus the bulk of my critical comments on his final attempts to provide a positive alternative. The rationale for the Validity Requirement, and the constraint on any principle proposed to replace it is, in slogan, this: "No truth-preservation, no non-lucky truth-connection. No non-lucky truth-connection, no warrant" (p. 58). While Gerken does argue that the first part of the slogan is false, he does endorse the second part: warrant requires a non-lucky truth-connection. The worry running throughout the book is that if a piece of putatively deductive reasoning is invalid, then if the conclusion is true, this will be down to sheer luck. This in turn is taken to be a problem, since Gerken holds that warrant excludes too much luck. But is this important assumption correct?

On the basis of appreciating the force of the Gettier problem, most accept that knowledge excludes too much of certain kinds of luck. But to hold that warrant itself also has an anti-luck condition requires some additional motivation and defense. By way of argument, Gerken offers the following case:

Consider Paul, who forms beliefs about the future by reading the horoscope in The National Enquirer. Both horoscopes and The National Enquirer are notoriously unreliable. By reading the horoscope, Paul comes to believe that he will die happy, that life will evolve on Mars by 2064, that his grand-daughter will become president and so forth. Assume that the future turns out precisely as the horoscope predicts. Consequently, all of Paul's horoscope-beliefs happen to be true. But they are not warranted. (p. 14, original emphasis)

Gerken argues that the underlying reason for this is that, given how Paul forms his beliefs, it is accidental that they are true. Rather, it is suggested that if a belief is warranted, it cannot be epistemically lucky that beliefs formed in that way are normally true.

While this is a possible explanation, it seems to be insufficiently motivated by the case offered. Salient here is not just that both horoscopes and The National Enquirer are unreliable, but, as Gerken says, that they are notoriously unreliable. Accordingly, Paul does, or ought to, believe that these are unreliable ways of forming beliefs (whether they are actually unreliable or not). We might think that it is their notorious unreliability, not the mere fact of their unreliability, that serves as a defeater for the warrant Paul might have otherwise enjoyed in cases of testimony by reading a newspaper. In order to motivate the idea that warrant excludes epistemic luck, what we need is a clear case where a subject lacks warrant, the belief is only luckily true (in the relevant sense), and the subject is not exposed to any defeaters that amount to evidence (misleading or not) that casts doubt on the reliability of the belief forming process. Perhaps then the best explanation of the lack of warrant would be the presence of too much luck. But I submit that Gerken's central example is not such a case.

Cases and thought experiments aside, is there theoretical motivation for the idea that warranted beliefs must be non-luckily connected to the truth? That depends on what warrant is taken to be. Alvin Plantinga has stipulated that his sense of 'warrant' denotes the property that converts true belief into knowledge (assuming that there is such a property). If warrant is understood in this sense, then it must include an anti-luck condition to avoid the Gettier problem, since knowledge must be non-luckily acquired. But Gerken explicitly says that that is not how he understands warrant, and allows throughout the book that warrant remains both present and unaffected in Gettier cases (e.g., pp. 26-33). In which case, why assume that warrant must be non-luckily connected to truth, rather than require a separate condition that might be added in an analysis of knowledge to rule out luck? All should agree that epistemic warrant must exhibit some connection to truth, if only to individuate epistemic warrant from other kinds (e.g., moral, pragmatic, etc.). But to assume that the truth-connection must itself take the form of truth-conduciveness (even in 'normal' circumstances) seems itself unwarranted, and insufficiently motivated.

Suppose that Gerken is right, however, and warrant must be non-lucky. Is his proposal that appeals to truth-conduciveness in normal circumstances correct? As the history of post-Gettier epistemology has shown, saying exactly what amounts to epistemically normal circumstances has proven exceedingly difficult. Having a workable notion of epistemic normality turns out to be the key to Gerken's positive account of the principles of epistemic reasoning (introduced in chapter 6). As I noted above, instead of validity, Gerken holds that epistemic reasoning that generates warrant for a conclusion needs to be legitimate. Legitimacy, in turn is understood in terms of safe reasoning-competences, which in turn are defined as those that would yield valid reasoning in epistemically normal circumstances.

Gerken considers and rejects the proposal that a subject's circumstances are epistemically normal just in case the environment is normal, where such environments are taken to be ones that individuate the subject's mental states. He convincingly argues that such a specification is insufficient: the fact that S is in her normal state individuating environment is not a sufficient condition for S being in epistemically normal circumstances, e.g., the subject may be in her normal environment, despite suffering from illusions and other epistemically abnormal circumstances (pp. 311-318). But Gerken does hold up hope for the following necessary condition on epistemic normal environments: "Normal Environment Constraint: S is in general epistemically normal circumstances only if S is in her normal environment" (p. 319).

Attempting to generate a counterexample to this principle, Gerken considers the following: "Perfect Twin Earth -- a planet isolated from Earth on which there is no twater, twaluminium, no-twin apples [sic], or the like. Rather, there is water, aluminum and apples. That is, there are no fool's kinds on Perfect Twin Earth" (p. 319). For a switched subject, this might be thought of as a non-normal environment, but one that it is nevertheless epistemically generally normal. Gerken rejects this counterexample, since he holds that while there is no physical difference between Earth and Perfect Twin Earth, as presented, there would be social differences which would result in the environment being epistemically abnormal (to take Gerken's examples, Denmark and Perfect Twin Denmark would be different countries, or the switched subject would frequently mistake people on Perfect Twin Earth for people he knew back on Earth, etc.).

But this example can be easily modified to avoid this result: consider Stunted Twin Earth -- this is a planet isolated from Earth on which there is no twater, twaluminium, no twin-apples, or the like. Rather, there is water, aluminum and apples. That is, there are no fool's kinds on Stunted Twin Earth. This planet is a stunted version of Earth, however, because human life never evolved on it -- there is no social dimension to the planet at all. Now suppose that an Earthling astronaut on a solo voyage crashed on this otherwise causally isolated planet. He is outside of his normal state-individuating environment; but he is lucky to have still found himself in an epistemically normal environment. On the basis of his perceptual experience, the astronaut can both know and warrantedly believe things like the following: "Of all the places I could have crashed, I'm very lucky to have landed on a planet rich in resources: it has water for me to drink, apples for me to eat, and even aluminum that I can use to try to repair my spaceship. Huzzah!" If so, then whatever else constitutes generally epistemically normal circumstances, appealing to a normal environment is neither necessary nor sufficient for capturing the notion.

A workable account of epistemically normal circumstances is key to Gerken's positive proposals, and yet despite Gerken's valiant efforts, it still proves very difficult to adequately understand what counts as epistemic normalcy. Gerken argues that since we have an intuitive grasp of paradigm cases of epistemic normality, the notion has some explanatory potential, even though it requires real work. Perhaps he is correct. But still, given the difficulty of understanding, in general, what constitutes epistemic normality, one might wonder: if this aspect of Gerken's proposal is wrong, does it matter? What if we abandon the idea that warrant must be truth-conducive in epistemically normal environments? If Gerken is right, it seems we should be agnostic about whether certain forms of reasoning and grounds for belief actually confer warrant, since it seems hard to know that these ways of forming beliefs are conditionally reliable in epistemically normal environments (assuming that we even can get a firm enough grasp on what a normal environment is).

But one might think that we can know that certain forms of reasoning and grounds confer warrant whether truth-conducive or not. For example, reflection on our epistemic practice reveals that seeming to see a table in front of one confers prima facie warrant to believe that a table is in front of one. I would submit that we can know this a priori by reflecting on possible cases and what it is to have warranted beliefs. What we do not need to know as the basis for this judgment is if perceptual experiences are truth-conducive in normal environments -- whether they actually are or not would seem to make no justificatory difference. Likewise, we know that the reasoning-competence employed in modus ponens similarly can yield a warranted conclusion, and the warrant of this judgment also does not seem to turn on whether such competences are safe in normal environments. Perhaps one might object that this amounts to uncritical dogmatism. But given that we can seem to know which kinds of ways of forming beliefs result in those beliefs being warranted, without knowing if they are truth-conducive in normal environments, casts serious doubt on the idea that warrant must exhibit a non-lucky truth connection.

While I am less convinced by Gerken's positive proposals of principles of epistemic reasoning, his book makes important and novel contributions to advancing several different debates, including both the epistemology of reasoning (including the surprising thesis that validity is not a necessary condition on gaining warrant via deductive reasoning) and the nature of mental content and the epistemological implications of anti-individualism. Perhaps Gerken's most significant contribution is that he convincingly makes a case for the importance of the methodology of pursuing questions in the philosophy of mind and epistemology in tandem. Anyone interested in these areas of philosophy, and their intersection, would do well to read this book.


I would like to thank Mary Carman, Rhiannon James, Daniele Mezzadri, Keith Wilson, and especially Mikkel Gerken for helpful comments on early drafts of this review.