Epistemology and Emotions

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Georg Brun, Ulvi Doguoglu, and Dominique Kuenzle (eds.), Epistemology and Emotions, Ashgate, 2008, 211pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780754661146.

Reviewed by Craig DeLancey, State University of New York at Oswego


Much of the philosophy of emotion is still devoted to armchair adventures in moral psychology or to unfruitful debates about "how cognitive" emotions are (usually phrased in self-congratulatory opposition to non-existent traditions of disparaging the emotions as always irrational, as mere feelings, or as without intentional content). Epistemology and Emotions provides a valuable introduction to an emerging interest in a fruitful new set of issues concerning emotions: investigations of the relation between emotions and knowledge. Although there is a long tradition of work in epistemology referring to emotions and other motivations, only in recent years has there been much explicit debate about, and theory development aiming to explain, the role of emotions in the formation and justification of knowledge, understanding, and perception. This book offers a seminal introduction to a broad sample of this work, collecting nine papers by different scholars.

The editors Georg Brun, Ulvi Doguoglu, and Dominique Kuenzle start the book with a very useful overview of their topic. They offer a plausible account of why epistemology is now open to exploring a greater role for emotions in our theories, and then they review some of the primary hypotheses scholars have suggested for this expanded role. They suggest that theories Phenomenology of the Human Person forces, explanations of salience, events that contribute to cognitive efficiency, sources of special but relevant kinds of facts, and sources of special non-propositional kinds of knowledge or understanding. The papers in the volume explore, or at least refer to, each of these possibilities, but this finely written and well-organized introduction stands alone as a useful and perhaps unique introduction to this emerging field.

Ronald de Sousa ends the book with a reflection on feelings and epistemology. This is a perfect bookend to pair with the introduction, since de Sousa stands as an essential figure for all of the papers in this collection. His 1987 book, The Rationality of Emotion, provides a kind of ur-text for concerns about epistemology and the emotions, drawing an analogy between emotion and perception that informs much of the work on emotion that followed. De Sousa's book also introduced the idea that emotions may play a special role in providing salience to epistemic judgments, solving the frame problem and related epistemic paradoxes. There is something like consensus in the papers in this volume that providing salience is probably one role for emotions that is relevant to epistemic concerns. In his contribution to this volume, de Sousa argues that we have feelings -- which he says are like emotions but simpler and potentially subpersonal -- which can also perform important epistemic functions. The paper is noteworthy both because he extends beyond his earlier work, and because of his attention to problematic influences of feelings upon knowledge.

Several of the papers in the volume defend views similar to de Sousa's claim that emotions are in some ways analogous to perceptions. Sabine Doring aims to explain how what some might call a contradiction between emotions and judgments is actually a conflict without contradiction. Thus, we might fear something we know is not dangerous, such as being afraid of heights in a context where we believe that we cannot fall. Doring's account depends upon the similarities between perception and emotion, the most important feature of which, Doring argues, is that emotions do not have the relevant kinds of inferential relations to other cognitive states that beliefs and related kinds of mental states have. Emotions are non-inferential judgments, and thus in important ways encapsulated from our other judgments. From our fear of some particular height we need not infer other judgments, such as that we might fall. Parallels with perception include that we sometimes recognize that an illusion is an illusion, but continue to perceive the illusory content. And so the problematic cases of conflict between emotion and content do not lead to states of mind like believing a contradiction.

Catherine Elgin argues that emotions can provide insights that, at least prima facie, offer information about a situation that can play a role in the agent's coherent collection of beliefs and perceptions. Unfortunately, she phrases this in opposition to a "standard view" that emotion is opposed to reason. Such a view is not standard, but it still is the case that we could use an account of how emotions might be useful in forming knowledge, and so her insights are no less valuable. On her view, fear is at least evidence that one is in danger. Emotions can show us response-dependent properties, as perceptions show us secondary properties. That we criticize some fears (such as extreme phobias) shows that we do have standards of what counts as proper emotion. Thus, presumably, we also have standards of appropriate suppositions regarding the relevant response-dependent properties that emotions indicate. This also allows emotions to provide information about salience. In this regard, Elgin sees them as having similarities to beliefs. In either role, Elgin suggests that emotions can be educated: the emotions of experts are more reliable than those of the non-expert in the relevant domain, and for all of us our emotions can be trained, including by the arts.

Christopher Hookway's paper is perhaps the most compelling example in the collection of making use of emotions in a context of traditional epistemic concerns. He makes a powerful case that we should understand the role of emotions in knowledge acquisition through an externalist epistemology. Hookway argues that emotions provide immediate judgments. A belief is immediately justified when it does not depend upon the believer being able to offer reasons or arguments in its support, and the believer would recognize no reason to provide such support. In an externalist position, this does not mean that immediacy entails judgments are unsupported by relevant kinds of information -- just that the agent may not be able to cite that information. These immediate judgments play an important role in distinguishing the salient, as de Sousa has argued.

Several of the papers in the collection provide a more skeptical perspective on the role of emotions in epistemology, and are more explicit in recognizing potential detrimental influences of emotions on knowledge acquisition. Daniel Dohrn uses Descartes as a valuable historical sounding board to ask about the role that reflection should play in epistemology. Dohrn grants Hookway's notion that we sometimes make immediate judgments, though he replaces Hookway's notion that immediate judgments are justified with a notion that they are blameless when no reflection is possible. Dohrn also grants that immediate judgments are sometimes necessary, but he argues that reflection has an essential role to play in justification. Reflection may have occurred before our immediate judgment, for example, and could have given us reason to trust immediate judgments of this kind. Dohrn also expects that emotions can be trained, and so reflection upon our immediate emotional judgments will be necessary to train our emotions to better identify salience. Thus, Dohrn grants Hookway's essential points while maintaining an internalist epistemology. We can hope that Dohrn and Hookway continue a dialogue on this topic, and converge upon an understanding of what our best understanding of the role of emotions may mean for the internalism-externalism debate.

Both Hookway and Alessandra Tanesini see in Peirce's pragmatism an important forebear. Tanesini sets out to provide a new definition of fallibilism that overcomes several objections. Fallibilism, she ultimately argues, is a virtue had by an agent -- and not, for example, a property of beliefs or of methods. It is the virtue of epistemic humility. Tanesini argues that emotions are essential to epistemic virtues, providing motivation and ways to recognize salience that can act before belief formation. They likely also play a role in the kind of openness to the views of others that characterizes epistemic humility. However, Tanesini does not ultimately clarify how this might be, and it remains unclear what role emotions may play in the virtue of epistemic humility.

Markus Wild distinguishes two epistemic projects, and argues that emotions can have different status in explanations in each. The first is the traditional project of epistemology, which is the justification of knowledge. The second is the "inclusive" project of understanding agents and how they come to believe things. It is the latter which is the natural home for reflection upon the role of emotions in epistemology. Wild grants that emotions can be part of virtue reliabilism, and provide an indication of salience, but holds that emotions can tell us nothing about the nature of knowledge. Furthermore, the role of emotions in the inclusive project must include an exploration of character: of how these emotions can be trained to be reliably virtuous.

Topping off these concerns about optimism for epistemology and the emotions, Peter Goldie reminds us that emotions can systematically mislead us. He reviews the work of Nisbett and Ross and others that shows that emotions can reliably lead to reoccurring and ill-advised judgments.

Paul Thagard's paper is perhaps the most different. His recent collection of papers, Hot Thought, introduces and defends a profound view of the role of emotions in knowledge formation: he argues that we seek emotional coherence in our judgments, aiming to believe what best coheres with our relevant emotional associations. In his paper in this volume, he argues for a strongly connectionist view of judgment, emotion, and other cognitive states. He rejects the position that any propositional attitude account of our judgments -- and of other mental states relevant to epistemology -- is either accurate or fruitful. The result is that he erases any strong divide to be found in the brain or its function between emotion and cognition. In the context of a discussion of epistemology, this suggests that a naturalized epistemology might significantly reshape traditional concerns about propositions and correspondence into something quite different and much more integrated with action, different forms of understanding, and motivation.

Epistemology and Emotions is a valuable collection of papers, a seminal work in what we can expect to become a productive new area of research. Brun, Doguoglu, and Kuenzle have done the discipline of philosophy a needed service in producing the first collection of its kind -- one we can hope will be the first of many.