Epistemology, Archaeology, Ethics: Current Investigations of Husserl's Corpus

Placeholder book cover

Pol Vandevelde and Sebastian Luft (eds.), Epistemology, Archaeology, Ethics: Current Investigations of Husserl's Corpus, Continuum, 2010, 240pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441106919.

Reviewed by Nicolas de Warren, Wellesley College


As the editors note in their introduction, the expansion of Husserl's writings in the Husserliana, reaching upwards of 30 plus volumes, has provided significant impetus to the growth of interest in Husserlian phenomenology. Increased attention to the innovative complexity of Husserl's thinking has equally motivated increased engagement with other contemporary philosophical approaches, with the felicitous consequence that the landscape of Husserlian studies is today as vast as it is diverse. The papers gathered in this volume were first presented at the 38th Husserl Circle Meeting at Marquette University in 2008, and were chosen by the editors with the aim of showcasing this vitality of phenomenological research. Thirteen papers are grouped into three thematic sections; although these three themes -- generously defined -- fail to encompass the full universe of Husserl's thinking, the themes nonetheless suffice to demonstrate how "Husserl" is "the name of a research project, which includes several Husserls, instead of a unified philosophical program."

Part I, "Toward a Broadened Epistemology," addresses select aspects of Husserl's account of knowledge. Carlo Alberto Sanchez endorses John Drummond's view that Husserl combines features from a coherence theory of justification and a justificatory theory of evidence into a "non-foundational epistemological project." Yet, Sanchez quickly regresses from this broadening of epistemology with the further contention that "the threat of skepticism . . . drives Husserl's entire phenomenological project." On the contrary, the three different paths to the reduction, progressively developed over the course of Husserl's thinking, refreshingly formulate a plurality of philosophical motivations for Husserl's project, including the transcendental concern with constitution that remains distinct from a response to the skeptical challenge.

In one of the stronger showings in this volume, David Kasmier takes issue with two entrenched criticisms of Husserl's method of free variation. Free variation is Husserl's bold answer to the classic problem of the knowledge of universals and the apriori; it provides a rigorous method for the "seeing proper of the universal as eidos." Despite its avowed importance for Husserl's phenomenological project, free variation remained incompletely articulated by Husserl himself, even if tacitly employed throughout his research manuscripts. For this reason, no doubt, free variation has received scant attention in relation to its importance. Against two common concerns raised against free variation (free variation is ensnared in a vicious circle since knowledge of the universal must be presupposed by the selection of any particular; free variation remains an unreliable form of induction), Kasmier diligently corrects what he identifies as a pervasive misconstrual of "the role of the type being investigated in the production of variants," as well as a blurring of Husserl's distinction between empirical and pure universals. For Husserl, the difference between empirical sciences and apriori sciences is not a difference between individuals and universals, but a difference of two kinds of universals. Accordingly, a pure essence is attained, or "purified," by way of free variation when "attachment to the actual world is removed from the empirical type." Husserl's method is consequently neither a form of induction nor extensionally grounded. Specifically, "the aim of the method is a purification of the type and not a discovery of the type," which is to say, an intuitive grasping of modal and structural relations obtaining across variants, thus disclosing the inner architecture of a multiplicity, or manifold.

Two papers in Part I attend to the function of the lived body in Husserl's epistemology, with both papers considering volumes recently published in the Husserliana. Luis Román Rabanaque turns to the 1919 Lectures on Nature and Spirit (Hua-Mat. IV) with the aim of sketching the noematic dimension of the body in light of Husserl's distinction between Nature and Culture. In contrast to Ideen II, Husserl suggests in these lectures that the lived body functions as a "bridge" between the regions of Nature and Culture. It remains far from evident in Rabanaque's treatment, however, what Husserl concretely means when he speaks of the lived body as a "bridge," and Rabanaque's conclusion (or consolation?) that "these are matters for further considerations" confirm the reader's suspicion that a bridge towards such a desired clarity is here not forthcoming.

Arun Iyer focuses on a single text (Nr. 9) from Husserliana XXXVI Transzendentaler Idealismus, in which Husserl advocates that "it is not possible to conceive of the existence of the world except in relation to consciousness" on the basis of his argument for transcendental inter-subjectivity. As with Rabanaque's contribution, Iyer's discussion tapers off without entering into the subtle details of Husserl's account of empathy, from which much of Husserl's form of transcendental argumentation, in this particular instance, derives its leverage.

The other paper in Part I is Daniel Dwyer's ambitious effort to engage "late Husserl" and Merleau-Ponty (why both authors are here together remains unexplained) with contemporary discussions.  Dwyer focuses on the question of "whether human perception is possible only to the extent that the perceiver has acquired the appropriate conceptual capacities available to specify perceptual content." In discussing this question, he places Husserl’s and Merleau-Ponty’s shared accounts of "pre-predicative and lived-through pre-logical experience" against the broader historical "disenchantment of the world" and its "elimination of the irreducible first person point of view as epistemologically relevant." Riding rough over critical differences between "late Husserl’s" and Merleau-Ponty's respective conceptions of Nature and subjectivity, Dwyer quickly covers well-trodden ground in outlining the contours of passive synthesis and pre-givenness.

Part II, "Toward an Archaeology of Constitution," considers the challenging theme of constitution in Husserl's thinking. Among the different areas of constitutional analysis famously developed by Husserl, the analysis of inner time-consciousness remains, along with the lived-body and spatiality, prominently represented in Husserlian research. Two papers foray into this dark forest of time-constitution, with mixed results. John Anders' contribution is perplexing. After reporting how Husserl came to abandon his view of memory as a form of pictorial representation as well as his view of time-determinations as a form of predication, Anders takes it upon himself to improve Husserl's time-diagrams in a way that succeeds only in producing unnecessary murkiness. Anders' fantastical re-engineering -- "imagine a pipe filled with some sort of fluid and imagine that we force waves to propagate along the pipe by hitting or shaking it" -- is unintelligible given (to note but one reason) the double conflation of movement and time as well as time and temporality in this image. Adding more cause for concern, Anders takes the diagrams from the Husserliana X as representative of "Husserl's mature" position while remaining ignorant of the Bernau Manuscripts. Attention to the Bernau Manuscripts would have saved Anders from rashly claiming that, "[Husserl's] diagrams are always two-dimensional" (in contrast to Ander's imaginative 3-D over-haul). In fact, Husserl did fashion a three-dimensional diagram in the Bernau Manuscripts in proposing to fold the paper (on which the diagram is drawn) along the (diagram's) axis of original presentations, effectively transforming this line into a crease, with retentional and protentional planes flanking down, each to one side, so as to form an uppercase Lambda origami figure.

On a happier note, Neal DeRoo examines the significance of protention for Husserl's analysis as it first truly comes to light in the Bernau manuscripts. DeRoo convincingly shows how Husserl ascribes a "positive" role to protention in terms of its striving towards fulfillment. With this insight in hand, DeRoo succumbs to an over-enthusiasm for the constitutional function of protention in claiming that "protention is tied more closely to intentionality in general and, by extension, to double-intentionality as well." The primacy of the future, insisted upon by Heidegger, cannot, however, be foisted onto Husserl. DeRoo neglects the ways in which Husserl describes the positive (i.e., constitutive) function of retention as an "emptying" of the fulfillment of a protention in an original presentation. The crease of original presentations (Husserl's preferred term for what he once designated "original impressions") defines what Husserl strikingly calls an "edge-consciousness" (Kantenbewusstsein).  The protentional and retentional planes are pushed against each other along this crease, each striving against the intentional pull of the other. All three dimensions of inner time-consciousness (retention, original presentation, protention) are equi-primordial, not derivable from each other, even if their joint articulation is centered on the axis of ever renewing original presentations.

In the first of two papers on the theme of horizon, Adam Konopka responds to Don Welton's critique of Husserl's Cartesian conception of the world as a totality (e.g., in Ideen I) by showing how Husserl possesses a notion of "environing world" (Umwelt). As with DeRoo, Konopka succumbs to the temptation of forcing a claim of primacy; his claim that the "environing world" is the "first concept of the world," underpinning different worlds (home-world, alien-world, life-world, etc.), runs aground on the shores of the life-world (itself admitting of plural significations), since it is far from evident how the "environing world" would constitutionally displace the immoveable ground of the life-world. The worldliness of the world -- to speak Heideggerian -- is not a phenomenon within the world nor a ground that would stand underneath lesser worlds, stacked upon one another like layers in a cake -- as Heidegger once impatiently stated this decidedly Husserlian insight.

In a more measured paper, Roberto Walton offers a detailed assessment of the "building-up" (Aufbau) of horizons. In this fine paper, Walton carefully examines the different strata -- descriptive and methodological -- in Husserl's concept of horizon and draws from a broad range of Husserlian texts. Christian Lotz brings Part II to a close with an illuminating paper on Roland Barthes' influential essay on photography, Camera Lucida, and its debt to Husserlian phenomenology. Arguing against a widespread perception of Barthes' conception of photography as committed to a realist theory of reference, Lotz refreshingly reveals the degree to which Barthes' analysis draws from key phenomenological insights into the image as a form of intentionality. Given this perspective, Lotz proceeds to refine Barthes' distinction between punctum and studium in phenomenological terms: "Photographs as signs, accordingly, are founded upon vision." A virtue of Lotz's analysis consists in bringing to bear on Barthes' account a Husserlian clarification of the photograph's noema. As Lotz suggests:

The point is not that the photograph's noema is defined in past terms, that is, in the form of memory; rather, what we really find in the noematic structure of looking at photographs is a structure that Husserl has in another context described as a mixture and coincidence of two acts, namely, imagination and perception. (161)

Looking at a photograph constitutes a consciousness of "as if recollection." One quibble might be raised, however, against this otherwise excellent paper. Lotz concludes his phenomenological re-statement of Barthes' analysis by claiming that the materiality of the photograph, on which the act of looking depends, is not and cannot be fully taken into account by Husserlian means. It is unclear why Lotz would make such a contention, unless his point is merely to underline that Husserl himself, in his reflections on "image-consciousness," never bothered with a detailed and medium-specific analysis of the materiality of images. Nonetheless, nothing prohibits such an in-depth phenomenological investigation of the materiality of an image. Husserl clearly recognizes the material substructure of an image (the "image-thing") and, moreover, understands "image-consciousness" (whether of a photograph, painting, etc.) as a group of nested intentionalities; we are thus able to toggle back and forth between different intentionalities, alternatively attending to the photograph as a material object (e.g., when touching up a damaged photograph), as an image (when assessing the quality of the photographic image), or in view of its depicted subject-matter (when attending to what is shown in the photograph).

In the first paper of Part III, "Ethics and the Philosophical Life," Dermot Moran investigates a neglected affinity between Heidegger and Husserl in tracking the parallel development of the homelessness of philosophy and the manner in which philosophical reflection ushers forth an unsettling break with natural existence. As Moran suggests,

Heidegger's 'everydayness' with its 'falling' is best understood as the counterpart of Husserl's conception of life lived in the natural attitude . . . Clearly, Husserl does not describe the experience of time with the same sense of existential involvement as Heidegger does, but there undoubtedly is in Husserl a complex approach to the experience of temporality and also of history (185).

In a provocative paper, the finest in this volume, Sonja Rinofner-Kreidl examines Husserl's critique of Kant's categorical imperative in light of Husserl's proposed re-formulation of this centerpiece of Kantian ethics. Although Husserl's lectures and manuscripts do not contain any detailed textual and argumentative engagement with Kant's ethics, Rinofner-Kreidl patiently reconstructs Husserl's objections to Kant's "formalism." Having identified three aspects of Husserl's critique, Rinofner-Kreidl cogently demonstrates how, for each aspect, "some basic misapprehension" lurks in Husserl's view: Husserl misconstrues the function of Kantian maxims in wrongly thinking that "every action is immoral whose purpose resists the attempt to universalize it"; wrongly argues that Kant's categorical imperative is devoid of content and neglects purposes; and wrongly worries about the issue of applicability in failing to distinguish between judicial and moral laws. In sum, Husserl's critique "does not rest on sound arguments" and, moreover, lacks a "sound understanding of the idea of a CI as it has been introduced by Kant." As Rinofner-Kreidl sharply remarks, "viewed historically, Husserl's objections are neither new nor productive in terms of encouraging hitherto neglected or unknown ways of considering ethical issues."

Damning as this judgment is, the subtlety of Rinofner-Kreidl's argument consists, on the one hand, in showing the clear inadequacies of Husserl's critique while, on the other hand, demonstrating how Husserl's re-formulation of the categorical imperative is not without merit, as it represents a crucial component to Husserl's phenomenological casting of ethics. Mediating between Kant and Hume, Husserl argues that moral judgments are based on values and ultimately grounded in rational moral feelings. For Husserl, a moral agent acts according to a categorical imperative under the condition that she apprehends its underpinning material value (and in view of striving to achieve a rational and good human life). In sum, "Husserl's so-called 'CI' does not represent a moral law, i.e., an unconditioned ought, either because it is a purely formal, maximizing or optimizing law that represents a generally acknowledged law of prudence or because it is of merely hypothetical nature." This "radically non-Kantian spirit" of Husserl's ethics does not imply, however, as Rinofner-Kreidl cautions, an ethical theory on par with a kind of virtue theory, as some interpreters advocate.

In the final paper of this section, Margaret Steele undertakes to "interpret and criticize" John Rawls' original position by means of a contrast with Husserl's phenomenological reduction. Given that Steele immediately announces that she "will not extensively examine the content of [Husserl's] views, but will rather take a meta-ethical position and try to circumscribe his general approach to ethics" (my emphasis; indeed, her paper contains not a single reference to a Husserlian text or specific argument), it is difficult to understand how such a critical comparison can at all find traction. Moreover, the opposition envisioned by Steele between the so-called "formalism" of Rawls' (Kantianism) and Husserl's so-called "non-formalism" is precisely what the previous paper intelligently unmasked as a facile and unproductive contrast.

In light of the editors' contention that Husserl is "the name of a research project, which includes several Husserls, instead of a unified philosophical program," one is immediately struck by the wide range of quality (argumentative, imaginative, textual) among the thirteen Husserls contained in this volume. One cannot help but wonder as to the cause for this disparity, whether it reflects the openness of a field newly energized or the chaos of a field unhinged from underpinning rigor, awash in too many ideas, arguments and texts (Husserl is one of those expansive minds in which one capsizes easily). At the cost of inviting the ire of colleagues and graduate students, such disparity in quality is due, I suspect, to an overly generous acceptance of papers at widely different stages of development or, conversely, a failure to exclude work in need of greater application, re-formulation and, above all, time.

Many of these papers represent at best "works in progress". On the one hand, one understands that a conference is meant to showcase the most recent and vibrant trends in a given field, thus facilitating the critical commerce of newly minted ideas. On the other hand, one cannot fail to notice a growing tendency to over-publish conference presentations, with the consequence of blurring, if not effacing entirely, the difference between oral and written cultures (and standards) of thinking. Truth be told, academic publication has succumbed to commodity fetishism to an historically incomparable degree, directly at odds with the spirit of Husserl's own philosophical production.  For Husserl, genuine philosophical exchange did not transpire primarily across the printed page (and not because he succumbed to a so-called "metaphysics of presence"). To Husserl now befalls the misfortune of spawning too many Husserls, and for a philosopher who wrote so much while publishing so little, the lesson exemplified in this collection of Husserls is that less would indeed have been more.