Epistemology Futures

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Stephen Hetherington (ed.), Epistemology Futures, Oxford University Press, 2006, 258pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199273316.

Reviewed by Bruce Russell, Wayne State University


In the Introduction to Epistemology Futures, its editor, Stephen Hetherington, says that, "The essays in this book contain provocative and thoughtful attempts to improve epistemology, by way of refinements, modifications, solidifications, extensions, or replacements" (p. 2).  Some of the authors of the twelve essays in this book think that epistemology should remain focused on issues about the nature of knowledge and justification, but others disagree.  Of those who think that knowledge and justification should remain the focus, some think that the standard method of appeal to philosophical intuitions in hypothetical cases is the correct method, but most do not.  Finally, while many of the papers address the issue of skepticism, in only two cases is it the central focus.

Four of the authors in this collection think that knowledge should not be the central focus of epistemology.  Christopher Hookway writes in his "Epistemology and Inquiry: the Primacy of Practice" (pp. 95-110) that, "The core question concerns how it is possible to be good at inquiry rather than, more simply, what it is to have justified beliefs or knowledge" (p. 101).  There are intellectual problems in all disciplines, including philosophy, and according to Hookway, epistemology should investigate what are the best strategies and methods to employ for solving those problems.  Perceptual knowledge does not result from inquiry (p. 100), but much justified belief, and even knowledge, results from pursuing our intellectual goals through inquiry conducted in a "responsible and effective way" (p. 104).  The value of knowledge stems partly from its origins, but Hookway thinks that much of it stems from its role as "a resource for the further growth of knowledge, for further successful inquiry" (p. 105).

Like Hookway, Adam Morton in "Knowing What to Think About: When Epistemology Meets the Theory of Choice" (pp. 110-30) thinks that epistemologists should consider strategies of investigation to determine what strategies are best pursued under various conditions.  Inquiry and investigation are ways of gathering evidence.  But isn't a belief justified simply in virtue of being supported by the evidence one has regardless of how one acquired it?  Morton doubts this, for he thinks that a person's belief might not be justified if she was lazy in gathering evidence (p. 120).  And the reverse might be true: a person's belief might be justified even if not supported by the evidence if she has the excuse that most people "in her circle" reason in the same way and the mistake she makes is too subtle for her to catch (p. 120).  Morton thinks we should focus on what he calls "big state rationality" according to which the rationality of a person's belief and action is a function of that person's "big state, their whole complex of beliefs and desires" (p. 126) and capacities (p. 123).  Morton's view about epistemic justification, which makes it partly a function of pragmatic considerations, places him in the camp of many contemporary contextualists in epistemology (such as Jason Stanley and Keith DeRose).

Like Hookway and Morton, A.C. Grayling thinks that the focus of epistemology should not be the traditional one found in analytic epistemology.  In "Epistemic Finitude and the Framework of Inference," (pp. 169-79), Grayling notes how successful most people are in epistemic practice, that is, in forming beliefs that go beyond their immediate experience and that allow them to cross the street without getting hit by a bus, to buy a newspaper, and to meet up with friends (p. 169).  He proposes that we study the commonly held and common sense conceptual framework, which is a deductive (p. 178), "inference-licensing scheme" (p. 175), that enables people to move from evidence to particular beliefs that are justified relative to that scheme.  Grayling thinks that the right way to deal with scepticism is not to try to defeat all the arguments the sceptic offers but rather "to offer a positive theory of justification, one that shows how justification is secured" (p. 177), namely, by an underlying conceptual scheme.  He acknowledges that there is a problem about justifying the scheme itself "which comes to the same thing as refuting scepticism in its most interesting and substantial form, namely, relativism" (p. 178).  In his essay, Grayling has nothing to say about how to refute this sort of scepticism.

Catherine Z. Elgin does not think that epistemologists should concentrate on knowledge because she thinks that science represents one of our best intellectual achievements but does not produce knowledge.  That is because knowledge requires truth and science relies on fictions (on "idealizations, approximations, simplified models, and thought experiments," p. 213) to aid understanding.  For instance, physicists will assume that gases are ideal even though actual gases are not.  Astronomers will assume that planets revolve about the sun in elliptical orbits, ignoring deviations, and economists will assume that agents are perfectly rational even though actual agents are not.  Elgin thinks that despite being false these fictions can aid understanding because "their divergence from the phenomena they bear on is negligible" (p. 213).  One wonders if Elgin is right in thinking that science seeks understanding, not knowledge.  Don't we know that the planets revolve in perturbed elliptical orbits about the sun, that real gases behave roughly like ideal gases, that the liquid in lakes and streams and that falls from the sky as rain is impure water? 

Other authors in this collection believe that epistemology should focus on traditional concerns such as the nature of knowledge, the structure of justified belief, and whether internalism or externalism is the correct view about justification.  However, their approaches do not involve the traditional appeal to intuitions.  In "Appeals to Intuition and the Ambitions of Epistemology" (pp. 10-25), Hilary Kornblith argues that appeal to intuitions can only help us to better understand our folk concepts of knowledge, justification, and the like, but that this will not help us discover what the natural phenomenon is like that we refer to by the term "knowledge."  We need empirical investigation to discover the essence of knowledge, just as we needed such investigation to discover the essence of water.  For Kornblith, "water" and "knowledge" are natural kind terms.

Empirical investigation will be important for Linda Zagzebski, too, for she thinks that ethics and epistemology should begin with exemplars of moral and epistemic goodness.  That is because she thinks that, "What we mean by a good person [whether morally or epistemically] is a person like that" (p. 135 in "Ideal Agents and Ideal Observers in Epistemology," pp. 131-47).  Once we have enough exemplars of good epistemic people on hand, we can empirically investigate, and find out, what intellectual virtues they have and how they conduct themselves cognitively.  Investigation of cognitive exemplars promises to settle disputes about what the ideal structure of justification is (foundationalist or coherentist), whether invariantism or contextualism is correct (and if contextualism, what sort), and whether reliabilism or something else is the correct theory of justification.  Zagzebski notes that it may turn out that there is no structure of justification that is ideal for everyone but that different structures are ideal for different people (see p. 146) so that a form of relativism is true.

According to Paul Churchland's non-traditional view of knowledge, traditional epistemologists were mistaken in thinking that knowledge is propositional, that is, that it is a cognitive state with a proposition as its object.  He thinks that animals and human persons have knowledge in the very same sense even though certain animals lack "language-like structures… [that] embody the basic machinery of cognition" (p. 51 in Churchland's "Inner and Outer Spaces: the New Epistemology," pp. 48-70).  For Churchland, knowledge is a certain sort of neural state.  He compares structural or background neural states to a three-dimensional relief map (p. 60) and one's current cognition to a laser light shining on that map (p. 50) or a marble rolling around on it (p. 60).  To know at the moment how to brush your teeth (see, p. 62) or that your mother's face is in the window is to have a particular arrangement of your neural network caused by the fairly stable background network of neurons and, say, current perceptual input and internal, relational properties of the neurons themselves.  It will seem to many of us that Churchland has changed the subject and has given, at most, a description of what causes a person to know (whether how or that), rather than an account of knowledge itself.

In "How to Know (that Knowledge-that is Knowledge-how)" (pp. 71-94), Stephen Hetherington tries to reduce knowledge-that to knowledge-how.  On the face of it, this reduction seems implausible because one might have knowledge of some isolated and esoteric fact (e.g., about the location of some rock in your back yard or the moon) that does not involve any knowledge-how.  Hetherington's view has the further consequence that the subjects in the original Gettier cases have knowledge and that knowledge (not just justified belief) comes in degrees.  He tries to defend these consequences by pointing out the errors he believes others have fallen victim to in judging that knowledge is lacking in the original Gettier examples.  But, as William Lycan says in "On the Gettier Problem problem" (pp. 148-68), Hetherington does not give positive reasons for his view, and his diagnoses of where others have gone wrong to reach "intuitive" judgments that are contrary to his own view are unconvincing (p. 162).

Jonathan Weinberg is the final person who has a non-traditional conception of epistemology (which he offers in "What's Epistemology For? The Case for Neopragmatism in Normative Metaepistemology," pp. 26-47).  He thinks that a pragmatic approach is the right one to determine both what method to use in epistemology (so is the right meta-epistemological approach) and to use in determining what rules to adopt for belief formation.  The pragmatic approach singles out certain epistemic goals, such as having true beliefs and having ones that have been arrived at in a responsible manner (normativity), and judges an epistemic methodology, and a set of epistemic rules, according to how well acceptance of that methodology, or set of rules, helps achieve those ends.  Of course, one wonders how, independently of appeal to intuition, one can distinguish appropriate from inappropriate epistemic goals, and secondly, how one could be justified in believing that the relevant goals have been achieved without relying on some non-pragmatic view of justification.

There are three essays in this collection that are more traditional in their methodology and their focus.  William Lycan (see above) argues that there is no problem with the Gettier problem, and even offers a solution to it.  On his view, for S to know that P is for S to have a justified true belief that P where S does not tacitly believe, or assume, something false (pp. 155-56; 166).  He acknowledges that his view implies that in the famous Ginet-Goldman barn facade case the subject knows that he is looking at a barn.  Lycan thinks that anyone who rejects a widespread intuition must explain it away (p. 164), including the one that he rejects in the barn facade case, but he thinks he has successfully done that in an earlier work (p. 158).

Mark Kaplan takes up a standard skeptical argument (in "If You Know, You Can't Be Wrong," pp. 180-98) that goes as follows:

1. If I know something, then I can't be wrong.

2. I can be wrong about almost everything.

3. Therefore, I know hardly anything.

A case can be made that the above argument contains a modal scope fallacy: to be true, the first premise should be read as "Necessarily, if I know something, it is true" but for the argument to be valid it must be read as "If I know something, it is necessarily true."  However, Kaplan thinks the argument equivocates on "can't be wrong" in a different way.  According to him, "can't be wrong" in (1) does not mean "it is not humanly possible that I'm wrong."  Instead it means that there are no special reasons to think that I'm wrong, e.g., no special reason to think that the bird I am looking at is a stuffed, rather than a live, goldfinch (p. 187).  But to get the radical sort of skepticism that the conclusion asserts, the second premise must be understood to mean "it is humanly possible that I am wrong."  Kaplan says that for a person to know that P she must "be able to meet every legitimate challenge to her claim to know that P.  Context influences what counts as a legitimate challenge" (p. 188).  So Kaplan is a kind of contextualist about knowledge, rejecting the idea that for the argument to be valid the second premise must be understood to say that it is humanly possible to be wrong about almost everything.

In the last essay in the book (titled "Epistemological Puzzles About Disagreement," pp. 216-36), Richard Feldman argues that where philosophers know the views and arguments of other philosophers with opposing views, they should suspend judgment about what is the correct view of the matter (say, about compatibilism or incompatibilism in the free will and determinism debate, or even on the existence of God).  After all, why should I think my arguments and intuitions are better than those of someone else who is intelligent, thoughtful, and has given the issue under discussion a great deal of thought?  He argues that similar things hold for disputes between highly intelligent and well-informed people in matters of law and science, politics, and religion (pp. 217-19).

Of course, there is an alternative view to Feldman's view that two people with the same total evidence for some proposition must adopt the same epistemic stance, that is, must both either believe, disbelieve, or suspend judgment on that proposition.  In ethics it can be permissible for someone to either perform, or fail to perform, some action.  So perhaps in epistemology it can be permissible for one person to believe some proposition relative to some total body of evidence and for another to suspend judgment, or to disbelieve, relative to that same body of evidence. 

However, Feldman points out that unlike in the practical case, where "there is no good behavioral analogue to suspending judgment" (p. 229), there is that alternative in the theoretical case.  The question still remains whether where there is the option of suspending judgment there can be situations where it is epistemically permissible for a person to either suspend judgment, believe, or disbelieve (or perhaps to suspend judgment or adopt just one of the other two options).  Intuitively, it seems that there can be such situations, situations where it is permissible for one person to weigh the evidence one way and another to weigh it differently, even though they share the same body of total evidence.

What should the future of epistemology be?  For instance, should epistemologists abandon "conceptual analysis by way of appeal to intuition," which Kornblith calls "the standard justificatory appeal in philosophy" (Kornblith, pp. 13-14)?  Nothing that Kornblith says makes me think it should, for it's not plausible to think that "knowledge" and "justification," which are partly or wholly normative terms, are natural kind terms, and as for the errors and ignorance that Kornblith worries about even if knowledge is not a natural kind, they can be dealt with through careful and reflective philosophical exchange between practitioners of the discipline.  Nor should we worry about the empirical data that Weinberg cites that shows that students from different ethnic backgrounds have different intuitions on Gettier cases and those dealing with the relationship between reliability and justification.  Lycan's doubts about the experimental procedures employed in those studies deserve attention (p. 164).  So does his suggestion that people from certain sub-cultures may be speaking a different dialect and so mean something different by "knowledge" than most people mean, just as his students split on what they mean by a lie (p. 165).  Most importantly, intuitions in philosophy play a role in a normative enterprise, e.g., a role in answering the question, "What should we mean by 'knowledge' given our initial intuitions and subsequent attempts by us to explain away conflicting intuitions held by others and their attempts to explain away ours?"  So the fact that students, or professional philosophers, start with conflicting intuitions does not mean that intuitions do not have a justificatory role.  Individual philosophers should not be trying to capture what they themselves, or people in their society, mean by, say, "knowledge."  They should be arguing that people should mean such-and-such once they have considered everyone's intuitions and accompanying arguments.

Further, neither the empirical nor the pragmatic approaches to epistemology seem promising because they both presuppose some conception of justification when they try to determine the essence of, say, knowledge, what the relevant pragmatic goals are, and whether those goals will likely be achieved by adopting particular epistemic rules.  In addition, Zagzebski's idea that we should start with exemplars of epistemic virtue and proceed empirically to discover how they conduct themselves and what intellectual virtues they possess sounds like the suggestion that we start with exemplars of bachelorhood and investigate empirically what properties bachelors have, including, for example, whether they are unmarried and whether they are male.  How could exemplary epistemic subjects lack the virtues that Zagzebski lists, e.g., open-mindedness, intellectual fairness, carefulness, thoroughness, etc. (see pp. 140 and 145)?  And can't we know a priori that such subjects must have these virtues?

So none of these essays convinces me that appeal to a priori intuition, and the analytic approach, should be abandoned.  And none of the non-standard accounts of knowledge sounds at all plausible, certainly not Churchland's identification of knowledge with a certain arrangement of neurons, nor Hetherington's attempted reduction of knowledge-that to knowledge-how.

There is some point to the essays that suggest that epistemology change its focus to look at what makes for good inquiry, or investigation, and what aids understanding, even if it does not advance knowledge.  But this just means that epistemology should broaden its scope, not that it should adopt a new methodology or turn away from investigating knowledge and justification a priori.             

I believe that epistemology's future will not be so bright if it takes "the road less traveled by" that is recommended by many of the authors in this collection.  Lycan and Feldman show that there are still interesting things to discover along the more traditional path.