Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis

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Bimal Matilal, Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar in Indian Philosophical Analysis, edited by Jonardon Ganeri, Oxford University Press, new edition 2005 (first edition 1971), 150pp, $29..95, ISBN 0-19-566658-5.

Reviewed by Charles Goodman, Binghamton University


Thirty-four years after its first publication, an important work of scholarship has been re-released. With this book, Bimal Matilal established the ambitious agenda which he would pursue in his later works, including his masterpiece, Perception (Clarendon Press, 1986). Matilal sought not merely to make a contribution to intercultural understanding, but also to effect a change in the culture of American academic philosophy that would bring Indian philosophers into the mainstream of philosophical debate. That Matilal had even partial success in this endeavor is a testimony to the value of his scholarship. That his success was only partial was due much more to the difficulty of the task than to the minor defects in his work.

Before Matilal, the study of Indian thought was dominated by two very different kinds of scholars: students of philology with no interest in the great questions of life, and enthusiasts of mysticism with no interest in rigor, precision or clarity. These scholars had a tendency to represent the teachings of Indian thinkers either as emerging through an entirely non-rational process from primordial Indian mythology, or else as the direct expression of a non-conceptual, mystical direct awareness. Matilal, on the other hand, showed that at least some Indian writers can more profitably be understood as arriving at their conclusions through various forms of careful reasoning, all of which have parallels (though not necessarily close parallels) in Western philosophy. These styles of reasoning are quite varied, and include regress objections, reductio ad absurdum arguments, and the critical deployment of the sophisticated classification of fallacies developed by Indian epistemologists. As Matilal claimed, the presence of highly developed, carefully stated arguments in the writings of a number of Indian thinkers establishes that they are philosophers in the most precise and restrictive sense of that term.

Matilal was not the very first writer to make this point. For example, D. N. Shastri’s excellent Critique of Indian Realism preceded Matilal’s major works by several years. But Matilal developed the case for the genuinely philosophical status of Indian thought in a more comprehensive way than had ever been attempted before. His qualifications for this task included an unquestioned proficiency in philosophical Sanskrit, an impressively broad knowledge of the Indian philosophical literature, and a thorough familiarity with several of the major philosophers in the analytic tradition, such as Frege, Russell, and Quine. As a result, Matilal was able to see connections between Indian and Western philosophical debates that have since become major topics in the scholarly literature. Juxtaposing the Nyāya doctrine of anuvyavasāya with Kant’s concept of apperception (p. 54), Nyāya a views about jāti with analytic discussions of extensional and non-extensional criteria of identity for universals (p. 47), and Hindu-Buddhist debates about perception with analogous Western discussions of the conceptual or nonconceptual nature of perception (in sections 1.5, 2.1 and 2.8, for example), were only some of Matilal’s important contributions.

Anyone who has been following recent work on Indian philosophy knows that Matilal’s agenda is being taken up by an increasing number of scholars. More and more writers in the field have found connections between the concepts presented in Sanskrit texts and the technical apparatus of analytic philosophy. To this extent, Matilal’s project was a success: he transformed the way specialists understand Indian thought. But Matilal also wished to bring Indian philosophy into the mainstream of the Western philosophical conversation, and to convince analytic philosophers generally that the Indian tradition was worthy of their attention. In this, of course, neither this book nor any subsequent one has been very strikingly successful; most analytic philosophers continue to ignore Indian texts.

In light of this extensive work bridging Indian and Western traditions that has occurred in the past three decades, some of the discussions in Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar have more contemporary relevance than others. For example, the extremely helpful and informative discussion in Chapter 4 of the Nyāya-Buddhist debate about non-referring expressions remains well worth reading. Matilal does a masterful job of clarifying the motivation behind, and the arguments for, the Naiyāyika view. This view, which maintains that no genuinely simple linguistic expression can ever fail to refer, turns out to have much more that can be said for it than one might think. Though in most of the chapter Matilal faithfully reports the Buddhist arguments, unfortunately the final section of the chapter, "The Pan-Fictional Approach of Buddhism," does not accurately describe that tradition. Matilal asserts that "In their theory of objects, the Buddhists were not interested in ontology or in the metaphysics of being" (p. 111). But important Buddhist texts such as the Treasury of Metaphysics (Abhidharma-kośa) discuss ontological issues at great length. The Meinongian attitude which Matilal attributes to a wide range of Buddhist thinkers cannot possibly be the view of anyone but the Yogācāra, and possibly not even of them. Even so, Chapter 4 remains an important contribution to our understanding of Indian philosophy of language.

Chapter 5, "Negation and the Madhyamaka Dialectic," was a major contribution when it was published, but has to a significant extent been left behind by the tremendous progress recently in our understanding of the Madhyamaka school of Buddhist philosophy, progress which has largely been based on a growing awareness of the content and importance of relevant Tibetan sources. For example, Matilal’s characterization of the Madhyamaka as holding that the phenomenal world is "indeterminate" (pp. 121-128) does not seem very helpful. At the conventional level, ordinary things have certain characteristics and not others, and so cannot be described as indeterminate. Meanwhile, at the ultimate level, these entities do not even exist. At neither level do they exist as indeterminate things. Moreover, scholars have come to realize that there are several ways of understanding Nāgārjuna’s and Candrakīrti’s statements that they have no theses or positions that may be more helpful than the one Matilal proposes.

In light of more recent interpretations of Madhyamaka, Matilal’s somewhat disorganized remarks on this school are not completely accurate. However, these reflections do contain some scattered ideas which remain worth considering. And the very fact that Matilal’s work has partly been superseded by other scholars working along similar lines is itself a testimony to the influence of his methodology, which was once revolutionary but is now standard.

Given its notable philosophical sophistication and substantial scholarly value, why did this book fail at convincing mainstream analytic thinkers of the merits of Indian thought, and therefore at bringing Indian texts fully into the conversation of analytic philosophy? Some small part of the explanation may lie in the infelicities of Matilal’s writing style. These include his graceless use of capitalization for emphasis and his excessive insertion of scare-quotes. A more important part of the explanation for the book’s lack of influence among the general philosophical community is its extremely broad scope, which is in many ways one of its strengths. Matilal discusses thinkers from the Nyāya -Vaiśeika, Sāṃkhya, and Mīmāṃsā schools of Hindu philosophy, the Sanskrit grammatical tradition, and both the Madhyamaka and the Yogācāra schools of Buddhism. Because Epistemology, Logic, and Grammar covers a very wide range of figures in various historical periods, a non-specialist would find it extremely difficult to keep track of the debates. Matilal attempts to mitigate this problem by offering helpful historical notes at the beginning of the chapters, so that with sufficient effort, this difficulty could be overcome.

This issue points to a serious chicken-and-egg problem facing those of us who wish to convince philosophers in general of the value of Indian thought. Analytically trained philosophers would not easily be able to read a book like Matilal’s without first acquiring a general sense of the figures involved, along with their historical relationships. But these philosophers won’t expend the effort to acquire this knowledge until someone convinces them that doing so is worth their while. Convincing them of the value of the Indian philosophical tradition would require a detailed discussion of the issues and arguments considered in that tradition -- precisely what a book like Matilal’s attempts to provide.

How, then, can contemporary scholars of Indian thought complete Matilal’s unfinished task? One possible approach would be to focus each work narrowly on a particular philosophical school or time period, so that readers can more easily pick up the relevant historical background. Another approach would be simply to lift particular arguments from their context and present them on their own merits, thereby demonstrating to a wider audience what specialists already know: that the Indian tradition produced fascinating arguments, some of which are quite unfamiliar to Western philosophers. Finally, those who know Indian philosophy could produce articles and books that address problems dealt with in the Western analytic tradition, use analytic technical vocabulary and meet analytic standards of rigor, but do so in a way that is shaped and inspired by Indian thought. This final approach is clearly the most ambitious, but it may be the only one that offers real hope of convincing the mainstream of American philosophy that Indian thought is worth some attention. Whichever of these approaches any of us chooses to adopt, all of us who try to bring Indian philosophy and analytic philosophy together are certainly following in Bimal Matilal’s footsteps, and we are all greatly indebted to his ground-breaking work.