Erfahren und Erkennen: Hegels Theorie der Wirklichkeit

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Dina Emundts, Erfahren und Erkennen: Hegels Theorie der Wirklichkeit, Klostermann, 2012, 430pp., $67.14 (hbk), ISBN 9783465037606.

Reviewed by Brady Bowman, Penn State University


Dina Emundts's interpretation of Hegel's theoretical philosophy is the revised text of her 2009 Habilitationsschrift, submitted to the Humboldt University of Berlin. In it she addresses the core project of Hegelian metaphysics and epistemology from three interrelated perspectives: What is Hegel's conception of experience and how does it shape the methodology of the Phenomenology of Spirit? What is Hegel's conception of cognition and what advantages does it offer over alternative conceptions such as Kant's? And what, according to Hegel, is the structure of reality and what kinds of objects does it comprehend? While the answers to these questions have broad implications for understanding Hegel's philosophy as a whole, Emundts's treatment of them focuses mainly on the Phenomenology; indeed, chapters 3-5 are cast as a sort of commentary on the initial four chapters of that work (up to and including "The Truth of Self-Certainty"). However, her main interest is clearly systematic and the textual interpretation is primarily geared toward filling in and further supporting the general view of experience and cognition sketched in the first two chapters, as well as developing an account of Hegel's ontological views concerning matter, force, organic life, and spirit.

Advanced Hegel scholars will find much to ponder in this important new contribution to the contemporary literature, but should be prepared to invest the requisite time and effort into working through Emundts's painstaking analysis. In this review, I will first offer a brief overview of the book's main topics. Then I will raise a couple of questions regarding Emundts's account of truth, cognition, and experience.

Emundts's main thesis, initially developed in chapter 1, is that Hegel's procedures in the Phenomenology of Spirit depend crucially on a concept of experience that is not reducible to merely conceptual operations. Rather, it involves an encounter with the world that is intentional (in the sense of being purposive or having an intended result), that reveals something new beyond the analytic content of a prior conception of things, and that includes a first-personal experiential content (Erlebnisgehalt; cf. 27). Emundts emphasizes that the experiences undergone by Hegel's shapes of consciousness force them to give up their previous position and take up a new one not on the basis of argument, but by virtue of an "insight that what I am doing is not sensible [sinnvoll]" (66). I will return below to the question of experience and whether it must not exhibit at least a very rudimentary argumentative structure in order to fulfill the role she attributes to it.

Closely related to this conception of experience are two further ideas. First, that a satisfactory theory of cognition must acknowledge and uphold the distinction between "knowledge and truth" (115), or as she also puts it: "That an assertion is true must mean that something is the way it is asserted to be, independently of the fact that it is asserted" (113).[1] Emundts also makes the considerably stronger claim that any position regarding the question of what cognition is and when it is present "must meet the requirement that it be able to make clear that something is the way it is asserted to be, independently of the fact that the position happens to be referring to it in a particular way" (114).

The second idea that Emundts associates with her conception of experience, worked out mainly in chapter 2, is that "for Hegel, truth cannot be something purely conceptual" (119). Rather, "conceptual principles can only be developed and explicated when they are realized, and they are realized in a process in which everything external to them is conceptually determined in accord with them. In this process, reference to the non-conceptual is necessary" (151). Furthermore, the necessity of a non-conceptual element is closely related to the necessary reference to the sensuously given, an element that is traditionally associated with the notion of experience. Since truth demands a non-conceptual element, and since this element is present only in experience, cognition as Hegel understands it is essentially tied to experience.

Chapter 3, entitled "Perceiving," corresponds most closely to the form of a conventional commentary. In each of the first two chapters of the Phenomenology, Emundts describes in numbered sequence the character of the position, its criterion of truth, how the criterion fails, how the shape of consciousness experiences what its object is not, how it experiences what that object is, and the overall result of the experience thus analyzed. Emundts refines previous interpretations of these chapters by arguing, in the case of "Sense Certainty," that the position fails not because of its implicit commitment to non-conceptual reference to singular items of sense perception (which Emundts judges to be unproblematic), but because it cannot effectively assert that its object truly exists without referring to it over an extended temporal span, thereby treating it as something "universal" (186-191). In the case of "Perception," she argues in a similar vein that the real difficulty lies not in a supposed contradiction between the thing and its properties, but in how to understand "a universal that perseveres despite the diversity of the singular" (216). The chapter also contains two excursuses on direct realism and the conceptuality of perception.

Chapter 4 interprets "Force and the Understanding" by demonstrating that Hegel's views here are best reconstructed as a detailed critique of Kant's analogies of experience (221). The chapter's main conclusion is that Hegel follows Kant in conceiving physical objects as determined by necessary laws of nature and hence by something conceptual. However, Hegel significantly departs from Kant in recognizing first that individual laws, as abstractions from a more concrete reality, are not exceptionless, and second that the supposedly purely a priori analogies of experience that Kant sees as a kind of unchanging meta-laws, are themselves empirically determinable and hence mutable (cp. 238-260, 297-298). In more positive terms, individual laws instantiate the relation Hegel calls "infinity" by articulating, in the form of equations, a higher-order identity between a simple principle of identity and the difference and multiplicity of singular objects. These objects themselves appear on the one hand as thoroughly determined by universal laws, but insofar as they are subject to a multiplicity of diverse laws they exhibit on the other hand a certain independence over against the universal (278-294, 300). This deeper kind of identity or universality is necessary for a coherent and empirically adequate conception of physical objects, even though at the same time it points beyond the physical realm of force to a conception of organic unity.

This latter idea is developed especially in the fifth chapter, where Emundts argues that matter, organic life, and spirit (Geist) instantiate three distinct kinds of object and that they form an ontological hierarchy such that spirit grounds life and life in turn grounds the material world (374). This ontology is said to preclude physicalist reduction: "the principles hitherto viewed as obligatory for matter must be transformed. The process of taking in nourishment cannot be interpreted simply as a chemical-physical causal connection conditioned by forces" (376). The work done in chapter 4 has already done much to motivate this thesis. But the argument Emundts gives in chapter 5:

If one asks why Hegel supposes that cognizing matter as determined by forces means to abstract from a purposive nexus [Zweckzusammenhang] and not the other way around, the answer must be: Because the cognition of matter as determined by forces presupposes something universal that is captured in the cognition of the world as a living and spiritual nexus. The fact that the principle of force assumed in explanations of matter is real (and not just an auxiliary construction or a fiction by the person doing the explaining) can only be shown by having recourse to living individuals and their relations, for it is only by such a recourse (and ultimately only by recourse to spiritual relations) that the conceptual principle of force can be revealed as a principle that is real. (376)

leaves me with some unanswered questions.

As stated here, the argument differs subtly from saying that the reality of the principle of force can only be shown by recourse to living individuals because the reality of the principle of force can only be shown by recourse to living individuals. Here, and similarly in some related contexts, further elucidation and elaboration would have been helpful in lending the thesis more force.

In the passage immediately following this one, Emundts offers an account of the way the spiritual or mental serves to ground the living and hence in turn also the material. The passage is not easy to summarize, and as it is also somewhat characteristic of this part of the book, I quote it at length:

When life is cognized as life, this takes place by way of its being understood as a unity that is preserved in the coming into being and passing away of living things. This can only be cognized by consciousness. However, the cognition of the spiritual world is also such that in it the universal, which also determines the spiritual world, is cognized as universal. This is the case insofar as the individuals can refer (in a particular relation) to themselves as the universal that is real in them. Thereby force is conceived in the spiritual world also as a universal principle that is real. This is the case insofar as spirit is the self-mediating universal principle of force. It is furthermore the case insofar as, for Hegel, the reality of conceptual principles is given and can be cognized by virtue of the fact that self-conscious individuals conceptually refer in common and consciously to the world and can also cognize it. (377)

Emundts goes on to state: "With this, the question can be answered as to how the spiritual is present in the living world and, conversely, how the living is present in the spiritual world" (377). I found the idea itself, however, to be somewhat elusive in these passages of the book.

Before closing I would like to raise a few questions regarding, first, Emundts's account of the relation between truth and knowledge in Kant and Hegel, and, secondly, the relation between experience and cognition. Emundts frames her discussion of Hegel with a critical analysis of Kant's views on truth. According to her, Kant fails to meet the minimum requirement on a theory of cognition by proposing a criterion of truth that unwittingly collapses the distinction between truth and taking-to-be-true (141). Emundts's reasoning is that, for Kant, the categories are constitutive of objectivity. Since she identifies objectivity with truth (141), she concludes that "for Kant, categories are not only the (necessary and sufficient) condition for every kind of object-reference, but also the (necessary and sufficient) condition for a judgment's being true. Thus epistemic reference and the standard of correct epistemic reference coincide" (142). So Kant's theory would appear to imply that all our knowledge of objects is infallible. Such an implication would of course constitute a very strong objection to Kant's theory of knowledge.

Emundts's reasoning depends here in part on her interpretation of Kant's discussion of the criterion of truth at B 82 (with further reference to B 236). She cites Kant's opinion that "there can be no universal criterion [of truth] with regard to content, but only with regard to form. A universal criterion of form is however not sufficient for truth" (133). She infers that the categories of transcendental logic constitute the universal criterion of content that formal logic is unable to provide, and cites B 185 in support: "Transcendental truth . . . precedes all empirical truth and makes it possible." But since the claim that "transcendental truth" makes empirical truth possible is not equivalent to Emundts's claim that, in the form of the categories, it is a necessary and sufficient condition for empirical truth, more argument is needed to make her criticism of Kant's theory of truth and knowledge fully convincing.

Hegel is said to avoid the collapse of truth into taking-to-be-true since for him "conceptual principles can only undergo development and become explicit when they are realized, and they are realized in a process in which everything that is external to them is conceptually determined in accord with them. In this process, the reference to something non-conceptual is necessary" (151). In other words, there is supposed to be something external to concepts (and a fortiori external to Kantian-style categories) built into Hegel's model of cognition that prevents epistemic reference and truth from collapsing into one another.

It is not easy to understand exactly what Emundts means this factor to be. "The claim to truth," she writes,

can only count as fulfilled when the assertion of knowledge agrees with the true, which is objectively determined reality or, in other words, the totality of all conceptual determinations that results from the process of conceptually capturing [einholen] all references to what is non-conceptual. (153)

However, this could be interpreted to mean incompatible things. On the one hand, "truth" is said to consist in the agreement between a single judgment and the totality of conceptual determinations. As she puts it in the conclusion: "The result of these experiences is the conception that the completely conceptually determined world can function as the standard of knowledge" (405), which sounds more like coherence than correspondence.

On the other hand, this totality is said to result from the "capturing" or "taking in" (einholen) of the non-conceptual. Here it seems fair to ask what such "capturing" is supposed to be if it is not just another word for the true description of an object or state of affairs, i.e., coming to know what it is. So while truth is explicitly said to be the totality of conceptual determinations (presumably a system of true, inferentially interconnected judgments), implicitly truth already seems to be operative at the level of single conceptual determinations (i.e., judgments) in relation to the non-conceptually given states of affairs they "capture."

My second set of questions concerns how the non-conceptual element is supposed to exert control over the process of its conceptual determination. Emundts underscores as one of Hegel's strengths that, unlike Kant, he allows for non-conceptual reference to objects, but at the same time she says that Hegel denies that perception is able to justify the truth of any assertion or to serve as a standard of truth (153). But then where is the justificatory relevance of such non-conceptual components of experience supposed to lie? For if they have none, it is not clear how can they be said to make any contribution to the genesis of knowledge.

In a similar vein, Emundts writes:

According to my interpretation, what experience [Erfahrung] really means is that consciousness learns something from its encounters [Erlebnisse] with the world. As to the question of the untenability of a position, the point is this: Positions cannot be maintained in light of experiences. The position that is being evaluated in any given case has to be given up because it has been refuted by experiences. Here there is no need to comprehend an argument or to register any inconsistency between beliefs. It becomes apparent that a position is untenable. (79-80; cp. 24, 101)

Emundts is right to warn against over-intellectualizing experience in general and the type of experience represented in the Phenomenology in particular. One does however wonder what, on her account, it could mean to be sensitive to the normative relevance of experience to belief if no argumentative structure or justificatory relation at all is supposed to be present. Surely the disappointment of expectations to which she frequently appeals as an important aspect of the confrontation with experience (e.g., 59, 69) would have to be cashed out in the form of an appropriate sensitivity to argumentative principles like non-contradiction and elementary forms such as modus tollens? Once again, a compact statement of the precise relation between experience and cognition would be helpful.

Emundts's is a rich and thought-provoking contribution to the contemporary literature on Hegel's theoretical philosophy and is sure to be widely read. Given the sophistication of her overall conception, the difficulties I have raised may well be merely apparent. For just that reason, though, a slightly more perspicuous account of the systematic details would have been desirable in some places. Also, given the length and complexity of the treatment, a less selective index would have been helpful for tracking the introduction and development of key terms, and a more liberal provision of compact, stand-alone statements of the main ideas and arguments would have served better to shed light on what is clearly a substantial and nuanced interpretation of Hegel's theory of cognition. By any standard, though, Erfahren und Erkennen will stand as an important contribution to the field.

[1] For the sake of convenience to a broad readership, I have chosen to translate all quotations into English.