Essay on the Origin of Human Knowledge, translated and edited by Hans Aarsleff

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Etienne Bonnot de Condillac, Essay on the Origin of Human Knowledge, translated and edited by Hans Aarsleff, Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 274 pp, $22.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-58576-7.

Reviewed by Jonathan Israel, unkown


The publication of this expertly edited and translated version of the Essai sur l’origine des connaissances humaines (1746) of the Abbé Etienne Bonnot de Condillac (1715-80) is welcome from several points of view and perhaps especially because French and other continental philosophy of the Enlightenment is still insufficiently known and discussed in the English-speaking world. During the late 1740s and early 1750s, Condillac undeniably made a substantial philosophical contribution and has even been described as “certainly the most important French eighteenth century thinker in the field of epistemology (or ‘metaphysics’ as his contemporaries tended to call it)”.1 At the same time, there is a long tradition of stressing Condillac’s debt to Locke, or referring to “Condillac’s brand of Lockean thought”.2 According to Hans Aarsleff, Condillac “admired Locke as the best of philosophers because he had studied the operations of the mind without reliance on postulates about its essential nature (p. xv). According to Condillac’s original translator into English, Thomas Nugent, Condillac “followed the footsteps of the celebrated Mr. Locke, not amusing his reader with airy speculations about the nature of the human mind, but attempting to make an exact analysis of its power and capacity, to know its operations, to ascend to the origin and formation of our ideas, in order to settle the boundaries of human knowledge”.3

Indeed, Condillac has often seemed a useful exemplum for those who consider Locke and Newton the prime patron saints of the Enlightenment and who hold that philosophically, unlike in their social and political thought, the philosophes essentially just followed the British lead. Yet it is not at all clear that scholars have been justified in drawing this inference. Indeed, when examined closely, it would seem that Condillac’s argument is not really Lockean at all, indeed that his gentle critique of Locke, in the Essay, is in reality scarcely less devastating than his onslaught on Descartes, Malebranche and the Leibnizio-Wolffian school.

Undoubtedly, Condillac, like so many of the philosophes of the High Enlightenment was deeply preoccupied with working out the implications of the great philosophical systems of the late seventeenth century. It is also true that Condillac is markedly more positive and polite when discussing Locke than when touching on Descartes, Malebranche or Wolff. But it has it be remembered that throughout continental Europe from the 1720s onwards, it was a widely familiar philosophical tactic to present one’s arguments under the auspices of Locke since Locke was the one major recent philosopher who was broadly acceptable to both the Catholic authorities –even in Spain – and Protestant theologians, being regarded as a safe pair of hands, the thinker who reconciles philosophy and theology and most satisfactorily protected miracles and the sphere of the supernatural. Claiming allegiance to Locke then was a way of claiming respectability and distancing oneself from more controversial and suspect systems.

In contrast to more obviously radical thinkers, such as La Mettrie or Diderot, Condillac—who entered the Catholic priesthood in 1741 but is said to have only celebrated mass once in his life—not infrequently invokes divine providence and the supernatural and was clearly anxious to placate conservative opinion; and, for this reason, it made eminently good sense for him to convey an air of proximity to English empiricism and remain silent about Spinoza’s epistemology. Yet when examined carefully, many of his comments on Locke are actually quite far-reaching criticisms, and as one reads on, it emerges that Condillac for all intents and purposes is demolishing Locke’s system and replacing it with something that is no longer in any meaningful sense Lockean. Thus, for Locke, sense is one thing, mind another; and while he avoids the dogmatic dualism characteristic of Cartesianism, there can be no doubt that it remains a high priority in Locke’s system that ample room be reserved for the separate existence (and presumed immortality) of the mind/soul. In effect he comes close to advocating a mind-body substance dualism without formally attempting to substantiate it. That is why Locke postulates a mind that is like a tabula rasa, something on which sense perceptions leave imprints and insists that thinking and willing are mental and not bodily functions. According to Locke, man is a body but also, at least as a working hypothesis ‘an immaterial thinking being’.

In Condillac’s eyes, Locke improved significantly on the Cartesians by seeing the origin of knowledge in the senses. But he signally failed “to examine the early progress of the operations of the mind” (p. 214). Condillac makes at least two and possibly three crucial moves which he claims Locke neglected to make, or should have made had he been rigorously consistent with his own principles. Firstly, by focusing on ‘first operations of mind’ and reducing these to the desire to experience more strongly, or ‘attend to’, certain specially striking, pleasurable, or painful, sensations, he argues that the human mind operates by connecting and recalling sensations. From this he proceeds to reduce all human thought to the ordering and elaboration of sensations: “the perception or the impression occasioned in the mind by the action of the senses is the first operation of the understanding” (p. 19). Everything else follows from that.

Secondly, Condillac lays great stress on our ability to mark, memorize, and discuss ideas by employing ‘signs’ – that is numbers, symbols or words – to represent them. Whereas for Locke, as Descartes, reasoned thought in the mind remains autonomous from expression in language, in Condillac language becomes the instrument of the higher forms of perception, enabling them to be transformed into ideas. Furthermore, what man expresses in the initial stages of language, before he matures to the level of being able to employ language as a vehicle for abstract ideas, is overwhelmingly declamation of raw emotion and appetite, after which he graduates to an intermediate stage where the aesthetic dimension, his responses to sentiment, rhythm and beauty, dominate his increasingly elaborate use of language. Hence the arts precede and are more basic than reason while language and linguistic usage, according to Condillac, pass through an evolution which mirrors the evolution of human reason itself.

Condillac, then, replaces Locke’s conception of mind as something non-physical and yet inherent in man which receives impressions from the senses and then reflects on them—that is what Cassirer called the ‘prejudice regarding innate operations of the mind’—with the notion that thought is just a higher form of sense perception, a rung on the same ladder of mental operations, which, of course, brings him much closer to Spinoza’s empiricism than Locke’s. As a consequence, as various commentators have remarked – though this is given less emphasis in Aarsleff’s introduction than it might seem to deserve – Condillac steers much further than Locke ever did towards a purely materialist conception of man and a sensationalist conception of the human mind, that is towards the oneness of body and mind and therefore to something which contemporaries would deem dangerously reminiscent of Spinozism. This uncompromising reductionism of thought to perception, as various commentators have pointed out, notably contributed to the purely materialist view of man evolving in the minds of Condillac’s more radical contemporaries such as Diderot and Helvétius.

But Condillac was no La Mettrie or Diderot, and his rhetoric about Locke is there for a good reason. In order to counterbalance the potentially radical implications of his monist epistemology, Condillac is careful to add when stipulating “that we do not have any ideas that do not come from the senses” that this applies only to the state we are in “now after the Fall” (p. 14). In this way he deftly deploys theology to guard his philosophical flanks. Such a position as he develops in this treatise would be altogether false, he insists, if one tried to apply it “to the soul in the state of innocence or after its separation from the body” (p. 14).


1. See Peter Jimack, “The French Enlightenment II: deism, morality and politics” in Stuart Brown (ed.) Routledge History of Philosophy V: British Philosophy in the Age of Enlightenment (London and New York, 1996), p. 238

2. Robert G.Weyant, “Introduction” to Condillac, An Essay on the origin of Human Knowledge facsimile reproduction of the translation of Thomas Nugent (1756) (Gainesville, Florida, 1971), p. xiv

3. Ibid., “The translator’s preface”, p. vii