Essays from the Edge: Parerga and Paralipomena

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Martin Jay, Essays from the Edge: Parerga and Paralipomena, University of Virginia Press, 2011, 266pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780813931333.

Reviewed by John H. Zammito, Rice University


In this new collection of essays, Martin Jay frames his long itinerary as a leading intellectual historian of his generation with a set of contributions complementing his many monographic contributions to the field. The title and subtitle foreground the simultaneously peripheral yet penetrating character of these essays. Not only does Jay take up Arthur Schopenhauer's esoteric title, Parerga and Paralipomena, but he situates the edginess of his project in terms of Jacques Derrida's exploration of parerga in Truth in Painting (1978), with its insistence on the blurring of frame and work, hence the incompleteness necessarily attending the latter and the disseminating supplementarity of the former. In all this, Jay shows how situated his own work is not only in the history of thought but in its shifting argots. The publication of such supplementing essays is not new in Jay's oeuvre. Earlier he issued a collection entitled Fin de Siècle Socialism and other Essays (Routledge, 1988) and then Force Fields: Between Intellectual History and Cultural Critique (Routledge, 1993). All these volumes serve as integument, threading together his hefty monographs without displacing their more intense and focused arguments. They also offer articulations of his sense of the métier of the intellectual historian and of the shifting theoretical frameworks in which that practice has labored in the last decades.

The first essays in the new collection go back to Jay's earliest preoccupations -- with the Frankfurt School thinkers Adorno and Benjamin -- and situate his views in terms of the contested notions of authenticity and experience that are as important for his current thinking as they were central to these figures from whom his historical inquiries set out. The most satisfying articulation of the problem of "experience" in the collection, complementing his monograph, Songs of Experience: Modern American and European Variations on a Universal Theme (University of California Press, 2005), is the essay "Phenomenology and Lived Experience," which explores a crucial caesura in European philosophy. Jay explores how the tradition of phenomenology from Husserl and Heidegger gets taken up in France by Merleau-Ponty among others, only to be fiercely contested by the newly ascendant voices of post-structuralism.

A very brief essay on the fading of the concept of revolution as a historical category in the wake of 1989 introduces the theme of historical practice, which motivates a number of interesting contributions to the volume. For Jay, those who "mourn" the passing of the metaphor of revolution are justified in insisting that we cannot do without such metaphors in historical conceptualization, but they run the risk of forgetting that these are only metaphors. He returns to similar considerations later in the collection with his essay "1990: Straddling a Watershed?" in which the question is about periodization as an indispensable recourse of historical thinking, pivoting again around the epochal sense attached to the end of the Cold War and the evanescence of Marxism as a paradigm. Jay concludes with a glum moral: "those who write history and those who make it (or more precisely, in most cases, suffer through it) are never able to share a common vision of its meaning." (185) His point appears to be less that historians impose some arbitrary configuration on the past which its participants could not have recognized in undergoing it than that historians are not any more adept than those participants in anticipating the future at play in their own present. Indeed, historians make very poor prophets. That animates the immediately ensuing essay in this collection, "Allons enfants de l'humanité: The French and Human Rights," which explores the aporetics of "human rights" discourse and the "unsublatable dialectic" (196) that follows.

A substantial subset of the new essays take up the question of "scopic regimes," Jay's fascination with the tropics of vision which informed his monograph, Downcast Eyes (University of California Press, 1993). Through these essays, Jay situates himself warily vis-à-vis the poststructuralist and postmodernist turns in humanistic inquiry, welcoming and yet keeping a modicum of critical distance from what he terms "the burgeoning field of visual cultural studies." (3) He notes that the "emergence of postmodernism" posited a "new scopic regime" with "the triumph of simulacra over reality," (56) and he worries about whether its construction might be overstated, holding out instead for "more complex, historically variable force fields of visuality." (59) Similarly, Jay worries about Zygmunt Bauman's extension of the scope of Foucault's analysis into a conception of "an essential cultural attitude underlying modernity tout court." (65) It is reductive totalization that Jay seeks continually to avert.

Two figures find recurring prominence in the collection: Hannah Arendt and Derrida, and in relation to these figures Jay introduces the most personal, autobiographical element in the collection. In "Still Waiting to Hear from Derrida," Jay writes of a cryptic letter from the French philosopher responding to Jay's discussion of his ideas in Downcast Eyes. Jay uses this to illustrate the intentional indeterminacy of Derrida's practice, down to the very obscurity of his handwriting. The letter is reproduced as a documentary illustration. (129-130) In "Intellectual Family Values: William Phillips, Hannah Arendt, and the Partisan Review," Jay recollects ruefully walking into a minefield of contentions among "New York intellectuals" in trying to publish an essay on Arendt's political thought. He brings the two figures together in yet another contribution: "Pseudology: Derrida on Arendt and Lying in Politics." Similarly personal, if only in asserting a clear sense of disciplinary modesty, Jay wrestles with his inclusion by a disgruntled Polish philosopher among a set of leading American philosophers -- Rorty, Putnam and Davidson -- in whose company Jay was "both flattered and amused to find myself." (163) This is one of several occasions through the essays where Jay reflects upon the uneasy disciplinary position of intellectual historians: figures on the edge, indeed, of the discourses they chronicle, yet inevitably penetrating into and elaborating those discourses because every engagement is a dissemination, and the disciplinary boundaries in late- or post-modernity are inescapably blurred.