Essays in Collective Epistemology

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Jennifer Lackey (ed.), Essays in Collective Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2014, 253pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199665792.

Reviewed by Deborah Perron Tollefsen, University of Memphis


This is a fine collection of essays that contributes to the growing field of collective epistemology. Roughly, collective epistemology refers to the study of the epistemological properties of groups and the significance of group knowledge production and acquisition. It deals with questions like the following: Are groups knowers? Do they have beliefs? How are group beliefs justified? Can groups be testifiers? Can we rely on the testimony of groups? Can we attribute epistemic responsibility to groups? Can groups have epistemic virtues?

Jennifer Lackey's volume is the third on this topic to appear in recent years. Kay Mathiesen's special issue of the journal Social Epistemology (volume 21,3) on collective knowers and collective knowledge appeared in 2007. Collective Epistemology edited by Hans Bernhard Schmid, Daniel Sirtes, and Marcel Weber was published in 2011. A fourth collection edited by Michael Brady and Miranda Fricker entitled the The Epistemic Lives of Groups (Oxford University Press) is forthcoming. The topic is hot and bound to become hotter now that "mainstream" epistemologists have turned their attention to it.

The origins of collective epistemology in its current manifestation can be found in the work of Margaret Gilbert and others working on group belief. Deborah Tollefsen's "Challenging Epistemic Individualism" published in 2002, Gilbert's 2004 article "Collective Epistemology" and Raimo Tuomela's "Group Knowledge Analyzed" draw out the epistemological consequences of theories of group belief. An even earlier discussion of the epistemological consequences of group belief can be found in Frederick Schmitt's 1994 article "The Justification of Group Belief" in Socializing Epistemology, a volume he also edited.

Lackey's book has four parts. Part one contains articles that relate to what Lackey describes as debates between summativists and non-summativists. Part two, "General Epistemic Concepts in the Collective Domain," contains articles that explore concepts such as epistemic virtue, rationality, and disagreement at the collective level. Part three is on "Individual and Collective Epistemology." The final section, "Collective Entities and Formal Epistemology," focuses on issues in formal epistemology, specifically issues surrounding belief aggregation.

In "Social Process Reliabilism: Solving Justification Problems in Collective Epistemology" Alvin Goldman offers an account of the justification of group beliefs. Goldman discusses Christian List and Philip Pettit's account of group belief. For List and Pettit group beliefs are the result of decision making processes that take individual votes or attitudes as an input and issue the group belief as an output. Goldman calls the function that takes individual attitudes as inputs and yields collective beliefs as output a belief aggregation function (BAF). He then proposes a way of aggregating the justification of group belief. He calls this a justification aggregation function (JAF). According to Goldman, the greater proportion of members who are justified in believing that p and the smaller the proportion of members who are justified in rejecting that p, the greater the justification of the group belief that p. The most important and, to my mind, exciting aspect of Goldman's article is that he has finally moved beyond traditional process reliabilism, which insists that "all belief-forming processes take place entirely within the head of an individual agent" (p. 23). Goldman now accepts that, at least in collective contexts, belief-forming processes extend across "agential gaps" along the lines suggested by Sanford Goldberg (2010) for the case of testimony.

Alexander Bird argues that group epistemic agents exist, that they have beliefs and knowledge that is not reducible to the beliefs and knowledge of their members, and that we should see the wider scientific community as an epistemic agent. The argument seems to go something like this: there are two ways to understand group epistemic agency, the commitment model, which Bird argues can be found in the work of Gilbert, Tuomela, and Pettit and the distributive cognition model (exemplified by the work of Edwin Hutchins). The commitment model, according to Bird, requires that members of the group (or some relevant subset) jointly commit or agree to accept a certain proposition as the group belief. The distributive cognition model does not. Because the distributive cognition model can make sense of knowledge in scientific communities and the commitment model cannot, it is preferable. Bird spends a good bit of time trying to convince his reader that the scientific community is an agent to whom attributions of knowledge are appropriate. I'm not convinced he succeeds, but the question of how to understand attributions of knowledge to scientific communities is an important one.

"In a Deflationary Account of Group Testimony" Lackey argues that the source of knowledge in cases of group testimony is an individual. In particular, she argues that group testimony is reducible to spokesperson's testimony (even when the spokesperson is not a member of the group). Lackey begins by considering arguments for thinking that groups are themselves epistemic sources of knowledge. One might be led to this conclusion via the following line of reasoning: We gain knowledge from the testimony of a group. In order to gain knowledge that p on the basis of testimony that p, the testifier must know that p. In some cases of group testimony, however, there is no member of the group that knows that p (because either they don't believe that p or they are unreliable). Therefore, the group must know that p. This argument rests on the principle that a hearer can come to know that p through a speaker's testimony only if the speaker knows that p. Lackey has argued against this principle in previous work (2008) and rejects it in this context as well. She replaces it with her speaker reliability principle (SR): "A hearer, H, can come to know that p on the basis of a speaker, S's, testimony that p only if S's statement that p is reliable or otherwise truth-conducive" (p. 77). Lackey argues that SR and her speaker view of testimony (SVT) support a deflationary account of group testimony whereby the epistemic status of group testimony reduces to the epistemic status of the statement made by a spokesperson. For Lackey, we learn from words not people. It should not be surprising, then, that she doesn't think we learn from groups.

Pettit's contribution might seem a bit out of place because its focus is on the metaphysical issue of group agency. But because Pettit thinks that agency is essentially tied to rationality, we end up in the realm of the epistemic. He distinguishes between personal and non-personal agency. Non-personal agency refers to a basic level of agency in which a system forms goals and representations and acts to pursue those goals in accordance with the representations. Automated vacuum cleaners exhibit non-personal agency. Personal agents on the other hand exhibit rational and reflective capacities that allow them to control the sorts of goals and attitudes they form and whether those attitudes conform to certain epistemic norms. Adult human beings are the paradigm example of a personal agent. According to Pettit, personal agents are detected through interpersonal interaction, not from mere observation of behavioral patterns. We might detect non-personal agency through observation of behavioral patterns, but personal agency is recognized within the context of rich practices of giving and taking reasons. Personal agents are conversable agents: "To put the difference in a slogan, it involves induction from interpersonal interaction rather than induction from impersonal interaction" (109). Having defined two forms of agency Pettit turns to the question of whether groups are non-personal agents or personal agents. He argues that the only groups that we can expect to count as agents will be those that exhibit conversability. If there are group agents, they are personal agents.

Sarah Wright shows how a theory of epistemic virtue might be extended to groups. She begins by introducing the distinction between two types of goals: telos and skopos. Our epistemic telos is believing well. But in any particular epistemic endeavor we may have the skopos of attaining truth. Due to circumstances out of our control, however, we might not always reach our skopos. The diligent student may fail to attain true beliefs about a subject matter. She will, however, still be capable of attaining her telos of believing well if she exhibited the epistemic virtue of carefulness, for instance. Because the focus here is on goals, Wright points out that extension to groups seems unproblematic. Groups have goals, and many groups have epistemic goals. It may be that we should think of such goals as merely the sum of the goals of individuals, but they are group goals nonetheless. As for the epistemic telos of the group, the epistemic telos of an individual is a long-standing disposition to believe well -- "to believe in accordance with epistemic virtues as part of the overall goal of living well" (p. 126). Wright suggests that groups, too, could have such standing dispositions to believe well. She goes on to raise and respond to several objections to the idea that virtues might extend to groups. I've often thought that virtue epistemology is ripe with possibilities for extension to groups. Wright's article is an important contribution to this underexplored area.[1]

In "Disagreement and Public Controversy" David Christensen extends his conciliatory approach to disagreement to the group context. According to conciliation, when an agent has reasons for believing that those who disagree with her are equally well-informed and have correctly reasoned, then she should reduce her confidence in the proposition that is under dispute. Christensen shows that when one considers group disputes, the conciliatory approach gains additional traction. In particular, group disagreements appear to be stronger defeaters of rational belief.

Ernest Sosa argues that the high standards we have for human knowledge are a result of the fact that we rely on others for knowledge. Epistemic competency benefits not just the individual who has achieved it, but also the community of which the individual is a member. It is because knowledge is a social good that our standards of reliability are higher than in other domains. Knowledge is constitutively social because reliability is defined in terms of the needs of an epistemic community. Sosa goes on to argue that the social nature of knowledge offers an explanation for why we value knowledge and how the pragmatic can encroach on epistemology. The article is an important contribution to social epistemology. It isn't clear, however, how it connects with collective epistemology.

Margaret Gilbert and Daniel Pilchman introduce some important methodological considerations. They begin by reviewing a long-standing (relatively speaking) debate over whether what are referred to as the beliefs of groups in common parlance are really beliefs or if they are mere acceptances. This debate reveals an underlying commitment to a certain methodology. This methodology privileges individual epistemology and assumes that whatever we have to say in collective epistemology must be modeled on individual epistemology. Gilbert and Pilchman challenge this methodology and argue that "one should not assume that accounts and distinctions arrived at within individual epistemology are appropriately applied within collective epistemology" (p. 190).

The last two articles in the volume take up the issue of judgment aggregation. Rachael Briggs, Fabrizio Cariani, Kenn Easwaran, and Branden Fitelson offer an account of coherence at the individual level -- one developed at length elsewhere (Easwaran and Fitelson, 2013) -- and extend it to the case of groups. Briggs et al. offer their theory of coherence as an alternative to deductive consistency. Likewise, they offer a coherence rather than a consistency based approach to the discursive dilemma. According to Briggs and colleagues, this results in the elimination of many instances of the doctrinal paradox.

Christian List draws on formal results from the theory of judgment aggregation in order to answer the question "when does deference to supermajority testimony guarantee consistency, and when not?" As List and Pettit (2011) have pointed out, reliance majority testimony leads, in some cases, to a failure of rationality because in some cases a majority of people could believe each of a set of propositions, but taken together the set of propositions is inconsistent. This is the much-discussed "discursive dilemma." List's piece attempts to make strides in determining just under what conditions consistency is preserved. He proposes necessary and sufficient conditions for achieving consistency while relying on super-majoritarian testimony and a condition for achieving what he calls k-consistency: something less than full consistency but where the inconsistency that is present is not too blatant. Though short, the piece makes strides in unpacking the notion of rationality present in List and Pettit's book (2011). More importantly, in the final few pages List raises the important issue of correspondence. Consistency is only one aspect of rationality. The more pressing issue is whether reliance on a supermajority really leads us to truth.

The articles in this volume represent some of the major issues and debates in collective epistemology. For that reason it will serve as a great introduction to the field. The collection suggests, however, that there is a need for some further reflection on (perhaps a refinement of) terminology. As a new field, collective epistemology is struggling to find the terms and concepts appropriate to its subject matter.

We see a hint of this struggle in Lackey's introduction. She begins by defining summativism in the following way: "According to summativism, collective phenomena can be understood entirely in terms of individual phenomena" (2). For those familiar with the existing literature on group belief this definition will seem a little odd. On this way of understanding summativism, John Searle and Raimo Tuomela will, surprisingly, be summativists. The term "summative" was first used by Anthony Quinton (1976), but summativism, as a theory of group belief, gets its clearest formulation (though she rejects it as a plausible account of group belief) in Gilbert's On Social Facts (1989). On a simple summative account of group belief, group G believes that p if and only if all or most of the members of G believe that p. The account is referred to as "summative" because the group's belief, on this account, is a function of the sum of individual beliefs with the same content as that ascribed to the group.

Searle and others have rejected summative accounts for a variety of reasons. Searle argues that collective intentionality cannot be reduced to individual intentionality. Rather, as individuals we have the capacity to "we believe" and "we intend." His account still appeals, however, strictly to "individual phenomenon", at least on one reading of what that phrase means. He does not appeal to a group mind or a group agent. Likewise, Tuomela offers an account of group belief in terms of individual members (in their positions within a group and within the right social and normative context) accepting that p as the view of the group. This rejects summativism, as there is no requirement that all or most of the members believe that p, but yet it clearly still explains things in terms of individual phenomenon (we-intentions are the intentions of individuals).

Lackey opposes summativism to what she calls non-summativism, "according to which collective phenomena are not understood in terms of individual phenomena" (2). This, too, is misleading. Gilbert offers a non-summative account, but it isn't clear she does so without appeal to individual phenomena. Joint commitments are not reducible to a sum of individual commitments, but they are formed by each individual expressing her willingness to be jointly committed with others as a body. Gilbert is a non-summativist not because she thinks the individual is irrelevant to understanding collective phenomena but because she thinks group belief (and group knowledge and other group attitudes) cannot be captured by summing up individual beliefs with the same content as that attributed to the group.

What Lackey seems to want to capture with her use of the terms summative and non-summative is the distinction between methodological individualism and methodological collectivism. These terms have a complicated history and have been defined in a variety of different ways. It isn't clear that adopting these terms to characterize the current debates is going to clarify things. Perhaps Lackey's avoidance of them, then, is a good thing.

One thing that seems to divide the terrain is that there are folks in the current debate who think groups are the legitimate bearers of cognitive states, such as belief and knowledge (and potential sources of information or loci of virtue), and those that don't. We might call the former epistemic agent collectivists and the latter epistemic agent individualists. This distinction tracks certain ontological commitments. It is interesting to note that unlike individual epistemology, collective epistemology is unable to avoid metaphysics. Individual epistemology certainly presupposes that individual subjects exist, but they don't have to argue for or against their existence or the existence of beliefs. A second thing that divides the terrain is whether group properties and states can be explained solely in terms of a collection of individual attitudes suitably interrelated or whether there is something irreducible about group attitudes. We might call the former reductionism and the latter anti-reductionism. This distinction tracks certain methodological commitments. John Searle is an anti-reductionist about such phenomena as group belief. Group beliefs, according to Searle, cannot be reduced to a collection of individual "I-beliefs" suitably interrelated. Rather, they are constituted by "we-beliefs". These are sui generis states. They are states of individuals, however, not groups, and so he is an epistemic agent individualist. Gilbert, too, is an anti-reductionist because at the heart of group belief and group knowledge is a joint commitment that does not reduce to the personal commitments of individuals. But unlike Searle she thinks joint commitments constitute plural subjects, to which beliefs may be described. So she is an epistemic agent collectivist.

The volume also highlights the need for reflection on our methodological commitments. It is for this reason that I think Gilbert and Pilchman's contribution is extremely important. Here is the prevailing recipe for doing collective epistemology: identify the concepts, issues, theories, and arguments prominent in individual epistemology and either (1) show how they extend to groups or (2) show that they can't be extended to groups. I've followed this recipe in the past, and it's the recipe followed by virtually every contributor to this volume. If group knowledge is knowledge, it needs to show some resemblance with the concept we are familiar with in individual epistemology. Otherwise, why think group knowledge is knowledge at all? But Gilbert and Pilchman point out that strict adherence to this recipe risks missing the unique features of what is referred to as group belief and group knowledge. It also sets up the possibility of a stalemate between those who pursue (1) and those who pursue (2). If we begin with theories and concepts tailored specifically for individual human epistemic agents, it is no surprise that many reject collective epistemology and no surprise that those defending it spend most of their time arguing that group belief and knowledge are really belief and knowledge.

The fact that this collection raises questions about terminology and methodology is not a mark against it. Rather, it is a testament to its breadth and depth. It will surely contribute to the ongoing debates in collective epistemology and will serve as an important resource for students and scholars alike.


Gilbert, M. (1989). On Social Facts. Routledge.

Gilbert, M. P. (2004). Collective epistemology. Episteme 1 (2): 95-107.

Goldberg, S, (2010). Relying on Others: An Essay in Epistemology. Oxford University Press.

Lackey, J. (2008). Learning from Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge. Oxford University Press.

Lahroodi, R. (2007). Collective epistemic virtues. Social Epistemology 21: 281-297.

List, C. and Pettit, P. (2011). Group Agency: The Possibility, Design, and Status of Corporate Agents. Oxford University Press.

Mathiesen, K. (2007). Introduction to special issue of social epistemology on "collective knowledge and collective knowers". Social Epistemology 21 (3): 209-216.

Tollefsen, D. (2002). Challenging epistemic individualism. Protosociology, 16: 86-117.

Tuomela, Raimo (2004). Group knowledge analyzed. Episteme 1 (2):109-127.

Schmid, Hans Bernhard ; Sirtes, Daniel & Weber, Marcel (eds.) (2011). Collective Epistemology. Ontos.

Schmitt, Frederick F. (ed.) (1994). Socializing Epistemology: The Social Dimensions of Knowledge. Rowman and Littlefield.

Quinton, Anthony (1976). Social objects. Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 76:1-27.

[1] See Reza Lahroodi (2007) for another interesting attempt to extend epistemic virtue to the collective level.