Essays on Kant's Anthropology

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Jacobs, Brian, and Kain, Patrick (eds.), Essays on Kant's Anthropology, Cambridge University Press, 2003, 278pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521790387.

Reviewed by Brent Kalar, University of New Mexico


This collection of essays is a welcome addition to the growing body of literature on previously neglected aspects of Kant’s thought. The “anthropology” referred to in the title encompasses not only Kant’s late work Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798), but, in addition, the lecture course upon which that work was based. Student notes from the latter have recently (in 1997) become available in a volume of the Akademie Edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften, the appearance of which provided the occasion for this collection of interpretive essays. The collection features original contributions by some of the leading Kant scholars writing today, including Reinhard Brandt and Werner Stark (the editors of the new volume in the Akademie edition), Allen Wood, Robert Louden, Paul Guyer, Howard Caygill, and Susan Meld Shell. The editors also each include their own essays. The essays cover a wide range of topics, relating Kant’s anthropology to issues in his theoretical philosophy, aesthetics, philosophy of history, and (especially) his practical philosophy.

Kant began offering a lecture course on anthropology in the winter of 1772-3 that he repeated every winter semester until his retirement in 1796. The anthropology lectures, therefore, spanning as they do virtually the entire period in which Kant was developing his “critical system,” provide a potentially fascinating historical window into the development of his thought. What was the conception of anthropology that Kant developed in these lectures? As the editors point out in their useful introduction to the collection, anthropology as conceived by Kant was a broad-based inquiry into the nature of human beings in general (p. 3). It was also conceived as a discipline that was empirical and pragmatic. It was to be completely divorced from metaphysical speculation, based instead upon observations of ordinary life (whether first-hand or through literature, travel accounts, histories, etc.). It was also to be useful, providing the kind of “worldly wisdom” that would allow one to get ahead in life, to successfully pursue happiness. As actually practiced by Kant in his lectures and subsequent book, anthropology involved a consideration of the faculties of the human mind in general (i.e., cognition, pleasure/ displeasure, and desire), of the “characters” of various sub-sections of humanity (the two sexes, the different nations and races), and of the “destiny” [Bestimmung] of humanity as a whole. In line with its empirical method and practical orientation, Kant’s tone throughout his anthropological writings is more engaging and popular, less technical and rigorous than in his better-known works. At the same time, in his anthropology, Kant deals with some of the same themes and concepts of his critical philosophy, such as self-consciousness, taste, and the highest good. Does this mean that we should take the anthropology to be mainly a popularization of the (developing) critical system? Or does it, on the contrary, have a systematic importance in its own right? In favor of the latter view, one might point to Kant’s enigmatic references in the Groundwork (and elsewhere) to an “empirical part” of moral philosophy, called “practical anthropology,” which would deal with “laws of the human being’s will insofar as it is affected by nature” (4: 387-8; 1). This, of course, is to be the supplement to (and carefully separated from) the primary, “pure” or “rational” part of moral philosophy, the metaphysics of morals. Whereas “practical anthropology” deals with how human beings actually behave, the metaphysics of morals deals with how they ought to behave. Nevertheless, Kant seems to suggest, practical anthropology is required to provide “applicability” to the a priori laws of morality, in order to make these laws “effective in concreto in the conduct of [one’s] life” (4: 389; 3). Is this “practical anthropology” what Kant intends to provide in the anthropology lectures? If so, do these lectures (and the resultant book) actually provide an essential supplement to the purely rational part of Kant’s moral theory? These are among the most interesting puzzles that have arisen in connection with Kant’s anthropology.

The interpretive essays in this collection consider a wide range of questions about Kant’s anthropology. They fall into two broad groups: those dealing with more “historical,” and those dealing with more “philosophical” issues. Several of the essays deal primarily with the ways in which the anthropology lectures illuminate the origin and evolution of key aspects of Kant’s philosophy. This group includes the essays by Stark, Guyer, Caygill, and Shell. In his contribution, Werner Stark usefully provides historical background regarding the academic and intellectual context in which the lectures emerged. Stark connects the emergence of the anthropology to the emergence of Kant’s conception of a “pure” moral philosophy. He finds it particularly suggestive that Kant typically paired his anthropology lectures with his ethics lectures (giving them both in the same semester). According to Stark, this pairing indicates a reciprocal relationship between anthropology and ethics, such that “neither can be thought independently of the other” (p. 25). Here Stark has in mind the relation between the “pure” and “empirical” parts of moral philosophy discussed above. He cites evidence from the lectures of mid-1770’s that show that even there, Kant insisted upon a reciprocal relationship between ethics and anthropology. Somewhat disappointingly, however, Stark does not pursue the more philosophical questions of what this reciprocity actually entailed, or whether Kant was entitled to assert such a connection.

Paul Guyer recounts how the anthropology lectures provide new evidence about the development of Kant’s aesthetic theory. What these lectures show, Guyer argues, is that most of the characteristic elements of Kant’s mature aesthetic theory were already present in early versions of the lectures. The key element that was missing, and only provided in the Critique of Judgment itself, is the connection between aesthetics and teleology. This essay provides additional historical support for a thesis that Guyer has worked out in his previous writings on Kant’s aesthetics: that the aesthetic can provide support for the moral only if it is independently conceived (or “autonomous”).

Howard Caygill provides a valuable contribution to our understanding of the development of Kant’s theoretical philosophy. He argues that the anthropology course was the principal place where Kant worked out his novel doctrine of sensibility (as a unique faculty of the mind). In particular, it was primarily in the anthropology lectures that Kant worked out his defense of sensibility against rationalist objections (such as the objection that the senses served only to confuse the understanding). Caygill evidently believes that the theory of sensibility is the key innovation of Kant’s “critical period,” but he does not really argue for that point here. He does, however, carefully trace the steps by which Kant separated his view from that of his rationalist predecessors.

Finally, Susan Meld Shell traces the evolution of Kant’s conception of happiness, as this is reflected in the anthropology lectures. Her basic thesis is that the lectures document a turning-point in Kant’s conception of happiness, caused by his reading of Pietro Verri’s del piacere e del dolere, which convinced him that human life necessarily involves more pain than pleasure. This encounter with Verri made Kant shift to a more pessimistic conception of human life and a sterner view of what type of happiness is achievable by human beings. Needless to say, Verri’s thesis is highly controversial, and one might wish for more discussion of Kant’s reasons for adopting it than Shell provides here. Nevertheless, she does present a well-documented case for her historical thesis.

While the predominantly historical essays will be interesting for specialists in the various areas of Kant scholarship, a perhaps more intriguing question for philosophers with a more general interest in Kant is whether the newly published anthropology lectures in any way force a reassessment of key aspects of Kant’s philosophy. The best cases for and against such a conclusion are made in essays dealing with aspects of Kant’s practical philosophy, including those by Wood, Jacobs, Kain, Brandt, and Louden. Allen Wood disputes the view, put forth by Alasdair MacIntyre among others, that Kant’s only conception of human nature is one that involves (quoting MacIntyre) “the physiological and non-rational side of man” (p. 42). It is natural, Wood admits, to think that Kant must regard (empirical) anthropology as a mechanistic natural science that excludes freedom (p. 43). This certainly seems to follow from Kant’s view of “the empirical world of nature as a strictly deterministic causal mechanism, in which no free agency could be found” (ibid.). However, Wood argues that this conclusion ignores the fact that for Kant, “our only coherent conception of ourselves, as moral agents or even as subjects of theoretical judgment, is one which presupposes from a practical standpoint that we are free” (p. 44). Wood holds that, because of this, Kant’s empirical anthropology also “interprets the empirical observations that it makes on the basis of [the presupposition that human beings are free]” (ibid.). The “pragmatic” character of Kant’s anthropology, then, also refers to the fact that it deals with human nature as something that is at least in part the product of free agency. If Wood is correct about this Kant, in his anthropological thought, self-consciously blurs his famous distinction between the “two standpoints”: a theoretical standpoint from which we regard ourselves as thoroughly determined by mechanical causes and a practical standpoint from which we regard ourselves as self-determining agents. Wood proposes that, in his anthropology, Kant adopts a hybrid of these two standpoints: a theoretical standpoint from which we regard ourselves as autonomous.

Two questions immediately arise in connection with Wood’s intriguing proposal. First, is Kant’s methodological presupposition in the anthropology in fact as Wood describes? Second, is this presupposition legitimate, given the strictures imposed by the critical philosophy? Wood seems to believe that it is legitimate, but one could raise doubts about this. As regards the first question, it is hard to dispute Wood’s point. First of all, Kant introduces anthropology in the published work as a body of knowledge which aims at “what man makes, can, or should make of himself as a freely acting being” (7: 119; 3 [emphasis added]). Moreover, the actual orientation of the anthropology towards practical, “worldly” knowledge supports this characterization of it, and hence does indeed suggest that it is an inquiry based on the presupposition of human freedom. It is less obvious, however, that Kant is entitled to this assumption. Shouldn’t any properly empirical inquiry for Kant be based upon an investigation of efficient (mechanical) causes? How is Kant’s apparent procedure in the anthropology consistent with his claims in the Critiques that, in principle at least, the conduct of a human being is just as predicable as the occurrence of “a solar or lunar eclipse” (5:99; 83)? If this claim about predictability is true, what is the point of regarding human beings as free when we are observing them (from the empirical perspective)? Wood’s reply is based on the presupposition that Kant is fundamentally skeptical about the prospects of a predictive science of human behavior. Wood argues that Kant’s claims about predictability, such as the one cited above, express merely “metaphysical propositions” that “do not indicate anything about any possible program of empirical research into human actions” (p. 44). Kant, on Wood’s view, ruled out a priori the possibility that there could be a predictive science of human behavior analogous to the science of mechanics. So the predictability Kant is talking about in the above passage must remain forever “in principle” predictability. Why did Kant think this? According to Wood, there are several reasons. First, Kant denied that it was possible to explain the connection between the corporeal and the mental, hence “any mechanistic laws governing acts of the mind would have to involve a psychological determinism cut off from the causality of objects of outer sense” (p. 45). Second, our consciousness of “the appearances of inner sense” – especially of our own motives – is characterized by a lack of certainly and self-deception (p. 45). Finally, we cannot tell what persons’ underlying principles of action are by observing their (habitual) behavior, “for any habit is consistent with a variety of traits or dispositions” (p. 48). This would be an obstacle to forming reliable generalizations about human behavior because we could not predict from observing what people habitually do how they would behave in novel or unusual situations.

Wood puts forth a very convincing textual case for ascribing this view to Kant. He evidently also believes that the position he attributes to Kant is a sound one. Is he right about this? Certainly, if one assumes that (1) we require, for practical purposes, a working knowledge of how human beings usually behave, yet (2) the mechanical model of human behavior cannot provide this, then it does indeed seem reasonable to conclude that we need to adopt some other model. Since the only available alternative is the model that considers human beings as free rational agents, we need to adopt this model for the empirical study of human beings. Assumption (1) above can hardly be disputed. But how can we be so sure that assumption (2) is the right one? One might think that the Kant emphasized by Wood is excessively “defeatist” about the prospects of a mechanistic empirical psychology. At any rate, the reasons Wood cites do not seem to me to actually rule out the possibility that there could (someday) be a predictive science of human behavior analogous to the science of mechanics. To begin with, it is unclear why solving the mind-body problem should be a condition of a predictive science of human behavior. One would think that such a science could remain wholly on the level of outer appearances, and disregard the inner, “mental” side of the picture altogether. For the same reason, the uncertainty and deceptiveness characteristic of our awareness of our own motives would be irrelevant to a mechanistic behavioral science. The motives would not matter, as long as we could accurately predict the behavior that resulted from them. Nor does the last reason Wood gives seem entirely convincing to me. The problem of predicting how a person would behave in unusual situations from how they behave in familiar ones is a real issue, but there is no reason to believe it is unsolvable. For one thing, we can rely on observations of how other people with similar habits have behaved when confronted with a certain situation. Of course, due to the inherent complexity of the phenomena, we should expect that our ability to predict will probably always be less than perfect. Nevertheless, I cannot see why the possibility of a highly reliable predictive science of human behavior should be ruled out a priori.

Wood does, however, at least raise the interesting possibility that there is room in Kant’s thought for a “third standpoint” that unites the theoretical and the practical. In the most philosophically interesting part of his contribution, Brian Jacobs develops this idea with his suggestion that the solution to the problem of finding a basis for the unification of the physiological and practical perspectives on the human being is to be found in Kant’s anthropological conception of “character.” As Jacobs understands it, this conception of character possesses an ambiguity that particularly suits it for being a bridge between the natural and the moral conceptions of the human being. As he puts it, for Kant, “character ought to reveal both the basic psychological constitution of the person and the unmistakable traces of an intelligibly autonomous self” (p. 120). The term “character” refers to both the observable behavior of a person and a moral property – the person’s “way of thinking” – that is not and never can be observed. The link between these two senses of the term is the fact that the observable behavior “stands in for” – we might say expresses – the moral property. Mysterious as this notion is, it is congruent with what Kant says about beauty “symbolizing” morality in the Critique of Judgment. Nevertheless, as Jacobs points out, “characterization” for Kant must be distinguished from symbolization, insofar as only in the case of the latter function does the observed resemble the unobserved. If this is correct, then Kant operated with two distinct conceptions of ways in which the empirical phenomena could “express” the purely intelligible.

Patrick Kain, like Wood, contests what he sees as a widespread misconception about Kant’s moral psychology. In Kain’s case, this is the view held by some contemporary Kantians that Kant does not (and perhaps cannot) provide any independent account of the normativity of prudential reason. Kain suggests that such an account might be based upon Kant’s idea that one’s own happiness or well-being is a “necessary end” (p. 250). This might explain, he thinks, why Kant believes that there is something irrational about pursuing a particular end or object that is in conflict with one’s clear overall well-being; in the face of such a conflict, it only makes sense to give up the only end one can give up, namely, the particular end (Ibid.). As Kain recognizes, however, this entire line of argument depends upon establishing that happiness is in fact a necessary end. And this is a notion, as several commentators have recognized, which is very difficult to reconcile with central doctrines of Kant’s moral theory, such as his view that the free will chooses its own ends.

In addition to these questions about Kant’s moral psychology, there is the previously discussed question how we are to understand the relation of the anthropology writings to the critical system. Several of the authors touch on this question in one way or another, but it is Reinhard Brandt and Robert Louden who most clearly offer opposing estimations of the systematic importance of the anthropology. Brandt is convinced that pragmatic anthropology “neither belongs to philosophy in a strict sense, nor is it articulated as a system based upon an idea of reason” (p. 85). In support of this claim, Brandt first argues that there is no obvious conceptual link between the two main divisions of the Anthropology, the “didactic” and the “characteristic” (p. 89). Whatever unity is to be found here is, according to Brandt, something that developed only gradually and in stages, as Kant groped, in successive versions of the lectures, towards a progressively more complete presentation of a “doctrine of prudence” (the knowledge necessary for the successful pursuit of happiness in the world) (p. 91). Because of this basic orientation towards prudential (hence self-interested) action, Brandt concludes that “pragmatic anthropology” is fundamentally limited in its aims and hence cannot be identified with the discipline of practical anthropology that Kant claimed was the necessary complement to pure moral philosophy (p. 92). Finally, pragmatic anthropology is not properly philosophical, since it lacks an . priori dimension; even its discussion of the destiny or vocation [Bestimmung] of the human race “is analyzed entirely empirically and as immanent to the world” (p. 93). We may thus view Brandt as laying down a challenge (and laying out some of the obstacles) to anyone who would claim to find in the anthropology an indispensable part of Kant’s system of moral philosophy.

This challenge is taken up by Robert Louden. Louden concedes that “Kant nowhere (i.e., neither in the anthropology lectures nor anywhere else) hands over to his readers a single, complete, tidy package of moral anthropology” (p. 64). But rather than be daunted by this, Louden attempts to provide a reconstruction of the promised second, empirical part of moral philosophy from the material that Kant does provide. As against Brandt, Louden tries to show that Kant’s pragmatic anthropology does indeed have both a properly moral (as opposed to a merely prudential), as well as an . priori dimension. According to Louden, the “overarching goal” of the anthropology writings “is to figure out what human nature is like in order more effectively to further moral ends” (p. 69). In order to do this, anthropology must of course provide accurate empirical knowledge, but it is not at all a “Weberian value-free undertaking” (p. 79). Rather, it is a mode of empirical inquiry framed by the a priori assumption that human beings are morally free and are destined to realize their freedom through the emergence of a “cosmopolitan society” (p. 73). The descriptions of human beings that anthropology provides are intended to help realize this goal.

Through his detailed scholarship, Louden does a commendable job of reconstructing a plausibly Kantian moral anthropology that overcomes some of Brandt’s skeptical obstacles. However, there is another question that needs to be asked: does this reconstructed anthropology really constitute an essential supplement to the purely rational part of moral philosophy? Is it an indispensable part of the system of philosophy itself? Louden evidently endorses Kant’s claim that moral philosophy “needs anthropology for its application to human beings” (4:412; 23). This is, however, a puzzling claim if we have in mind the famous examples of moral reasoning that Kant provides in the Groundwork and the Critique of Practical Reason. There the pure moral law (the categorical imperative) seems quite adequate all by itself for providing us with determinate answers to moral questions. Consider a question like “Should I make a false promise in order to obtain some ready cash?” The moral law, of course, answers this question in the negative. Anthropological knowledge is not obviously needed in order to translate this answer “into human terms” before it can be applied to my situation. The answer given by pure rational moral philosophy is already immediately applicable as it stands. So here is evidently a situation in which anthropology is not needed for the application of moral philosophy to human beings. But this is not just any situation; it is the typical situation for Kant. So what was Kant thinking when he made his remarks about the need for anthropology in order to make moral philosophy applicable to human beings? One possible answer is that Kant was thinking primarily of moral education here. Anthropological knowledge is necessary in order to educate human beings morally, to “awaken their reason” and arouse their consciousness of the moral law that binds them. This interpretation is supported by passages like one cited by Louden himself, in which Kant explains why “morals must be united with knowledge of humanity” in the following terms: “The reason that morals and sermons … have little effect is due to the lack of knowledge of the human being” (p. 66, quoting 25: 471-2, my emphasis). In other words, Kant is saying that merely moralizing and sermonizing is ineffective as a means of moral education if one lacks adequate knowledge of the specific cognitive capacities and motivations of human beings. One must know how to effectively awaken and elicit the inborn moral consciousness of human beings, and this requires a general “pragmatic” knowledge of their capacities and motives. But here we are talking about the essentially empirical methods of practical pedagogy, which should not be considered a part of moral philosophy proper. Anthropology, in other words, stands outside the system of philosophy.

Essays on Kant’s Anthropology is a valuable collection of contemporary essays on a generally overlooked dimension of Kant’s thought. Whether one views anthropology as a vital part of the critical system or as merely an external appendage offering insight into the development of Kant’s mind, this collection shows beyond a doubt that the anthropological writings deserve more attention than they have hitherto received.


All references to Kant’s writings are given by volume and page number of the Akademie edition of Kants gesammelte Schriften (Berlin, 1902-), followed by the page number of the translation consulted. The latter are listed below.

Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View, Translated by Victor Lye Dowdell (Carbondale and Edwardsville, Ill.: Southern Illinois Press, 1996).

Critique of Practical Reason, Translated and Edited by Mary Gregor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).

Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, Translated and Edited by Mary Gregor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997).