Essays on Lévinas and Law: A Mosaic

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Desmond Manderson (ed.), Essays on Lévinas and Law: A Mosaic, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 270pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230202375.

Reviewed by Joshua Shaw, Penn State Erie, The Behrend College



Essays on Lévinas and Law: A Mosaic is a helpful new collection of essays that apply Emmanuel Lévinas' ideas about ethics to law. The overall quality of the essays contained in this collection is quite good. The book's editor, Desmond Manderson, warns readers in his introduction that the essays are "not intended as an introduction to Lévinas." (5) However, I found this volume to be more accessible than many publications on Lévinas. This accessibility may be due to the fact that several essays apply his writings to concrete cases and problems in law, with the effect that they highlight his philosophy's practical significance. Indeed, Essays on Lévinas and Law is a welcome addition to what seems to be a growing trend in Lévinas scholarship to chart out the practical relevance of his work for political philosophy, normative ethics, and, with this collection, law.

The editor, Desmond Manderson, contributes an introduction and also one of the thirteen essays. The essays are organized into five sections, each titled after one of the five Mosaic books. This organization is slightly misleading, however, since it suggests that the collection is more unified than it actually is. The essays were commissioned for a conference held at McGill University in 2006, the "Centennial Conference on Lévinas and Law," which brought together over 100 scholars to explore the significance of Lévinas' philosophy for law. Like other conference-based collections, Essays on Lévinas and Law contains essays on a broad range of topics. Given this breadth, it would be difficult to review each contribution. Let me focus, therefore, on offering a sketch of each section and on elaborating some of the strengths of the collection as a whole.

Summary of Contents

Part I, "Genesis", is Manderson's introduction to the collection. The four essays that compose Part II, "Exodus", address the question of whether Lévinas' understanding of ethics can be conveyed in laws. The gist of this challenge should be familiar to readers of Lévinas who famously associates ethics with acknowledging the utter particularity and incomprehensibility of the human other. Yet how does one convey this concept of ethics in laws, which seem to traffic in generalities? Further, how can Lévinas' account allow for the fact that some laws seem to better reflect our responsibilities to one another than others, which suggests that the relationship to the other can be more or less accurately conveyed in them?

Diane Perpich, Jonathan Crowe, Nick Smith, and Jill Stauffer address this challenge. Perpich gives a précis of the argument she offers in her book The Ethics of Emmanuel Lévinas. She argues that Lévinas defends a "normativity without norms" -- that is, an account of why we should be responsible for one another, an account that cannot be conveyed straightforwardly in any given set of norms, nor in any given legal framework. Smith and Stauffer also question whether Lévinas' concept of responsibility can be conveyed in law. Smith outlines similarities between Lévinas and Adorno, arguing that the difficulty in expressing Lévinas' concept of responsibility in law constitutes grounds for concern about Lévinas. By contrast, Stauffer praises Levinas for acknowledging the "productive ambivalence" that characterizes judicial judgments, an ambivalence she finds, among other places, in the challenges lawyers faced in the Nuremberg trials when balancing calls for punishments of war criminals with the delicate task of identifying fitting legal standards to be retroactively applied to their wartime activities. Crowe contrasts Lévinas' perspective with H. L. A. Hart's legal positivism to clarify Lévinas' view of the relationship between law and morality. He persuasively argues that Lévinas would deny Hart's claim that there is no necessary connection between law and morality and concludes that for Lévinas ethical experiences continually permeate and shape legal systems.

Part III, "Leviticus," shifts from the question of whether Lévinas' ideas can be conveyed in law to assessing their significance for specific areas of law. Robert Gibbs gives a nuanced analysis of Lévinas' perspective on the role judges play in arbitrating conflicts between parties. To paraphrase his rich essay would exceed the scope of this review. Suffice it to say that he develops his illuminating analysis by comparing remarks Lévinas makes on a passage from Deuteronomy with an essay ("Violence and the Word") by the legal scholar Robert Cover in which Cover reflects on the role courts play in slowing violence and permitting the accused to face their accusers. In his essay, Desmond Manderson gives a précis of arguments he makes in Proximity, Lévinas, and the Soul of Law. He proposes that tort law, with its emphasis on care and negligence (as opposed to criminal law or law governing contracts) expresses Lévinas' ideas about responsibility. Marinos Diamantides thoughtfully applies Lévinas to cases involving the withdrawal of life-preserving treatment for persons in permanent vegetative states.

Part IV, "Numbers," focuses on citizenship and what it means to have legal standing in a community. Sébastion Jodoin draws on Lévinas to show how international law relies on notions of autonomy which Lévinas criticises, and he shows how this reliance leads to a denial of standing to non-state actors in international law. Marie Falinger uses Lévinas in her contribution to reflect on the status of illegal immigrants in U.S. law. Dorota Glowacka draws on remarks Lévinas makes about forgiveness and witnessing while reflecting on the challenges faced by Holocaust survivors living in Poland after the Holocaust -- particularly challenges they faced in the wake of the massacre of some 42 survivors by the Polish townspeople of Kielce in 1942.

Part V, "Deuteromony" raises questions and concerns about Lévinas' perspective on ethics, justice, and law. A critical commentary on Manderson's Proximity, Lévinas and the Soul of Law by Simon Critchley is included in this section along with a reply by Manderson. This section also includes a pair of skeptical essays by Jesse Simms and Sarah Roberts. Simms challenges the tendency in Lévinas scholarship to conflate Lévinas' view of justice with Kantian, liberal conceptions of justice and draws attention to disquieting similarities between Lévinas and Carl Schmitt. For her part, Roberts questions whether Lévinas' remarks on justice are consistent with his underlying depiction of the ethical relation to the other as one of asymmetric responsibility.


Essays on Lévinas and Law is, in my estimation, a valuable collection. Some essays are stronger than others. Overall, though, the collection is an important contribution to English-language scholarship on Lévinas. To put it in perspective, let me say a few words about current trends in this scholarship.

One could argue that we are witnessing an "ethical turn" in Lévinas scholarship. Lévinas' early proponents in the English-speaking philosophic community, such as Alphonso Lingis, Edith Wyschogrod, and Richard Cohen, tended to emphasize his place in phenomenology, existentialism, and Jewish philosophy. A shift occurred in the late eighties and early nineties, what one might call a "deconstructionist turn," as commentators such as Robert Bernasconi and Simon Critchley emphasized to a greater degree his relationship to Derrida and the confrontation with poststructuralist thought that occurs in his later writings.

Roughly a decade ago, though, commentators began to raise questions about his relevance for ethics. These questions were initially posed as criticisms. Richard Rorty, Simon Critchley, and Hilary Putnam all questioned whether his philosophy, for all its talk about ethics, should be understood as a form of ethics, whether it had any practical significance for ethics, and, if not, whether this lack constituted grounds for rejecting it. Since then, commentators have begun to reflect more on the practical significance of Lévinas' thought. Several works have been published on his political philosophy, perhaps most notably Howard Caygill's Lévinas and the Political, and more recently a number of scholars, such as Diane Perpich and Michael Morgan, have sought to clarify his relevance for normative ethics.

Essays on Lévinas and Law can be read as part of this "ethical turn." Several of the essays in the second and third sections expressly tackle the question of whether his understanding of ethics can be conveyed in laws and, if so, in what ways or in what areas of law. Many of the essays also apply his ideas to concrete issues in law, including issues involving the status of non-state actors in international law, the role of care in tort law, the rights of illegal immigrants, and cases involving the withdrawal of life-saving treatment for patients in permanent vegetative states. For someone like myself, who is concerned by the tendency in Lévinas scholarship to distinguish too sharply his concept of ethics from the traditional problems and goals of normative ethics, the essays contained in Essays on Lévinas and Law are a welcome addition to the secondary literature.

Indeed, reading this book is like joining a stimulating dialogue. Because the collection is based on conference papers, the essays tend to be short, focused pieces that briefly sketch out provocative interpretations and applications of Lévinas' thought rather than sustained meditations on his philosophy as a whole. Some might find this brevity frustrating, but I found it refreshing to be able to canvas such a wide array of interpretations in such a short space (270 pages).

It is to the book's credit that its contributors do not all agree in their readings of Lévinas. Some doubt whether his ideas about ethics can be conveyed in law; others find them reflected in certain areas or in certain approaches to law. Some praise him for advancing an understanding of ethics that cannot be conveyed in any legal system; others fault him on this same point. Others ignore these larger, more abstract questions in order to apply his writings to particular cases or puzzles in law. The effect of this plurality of perspectives is that the reader feels as though she is being invited to join a conversation -- an ongoing debate over the practical relevance of Lévinas' work. In this way, the collection makes good on its self-description as a "mosaic." A picture of Lévinas' philosophy of law emerges, but it is one made up of fragmentary perspectives and insights.

Finally, it is exciting to see Lévinas' work being placed in conversation with a new range of thinkers. These include other continental philosophers (Heidegger, Benjamin, Adorno, Derrida, and Agamben) analytic philosophers (Korsgaard, Rawls), and philosophers of law (H. L. A. Hare, Joseph Raz, Robert Cover, Ronald Dworkin). Some might worry that comparing Lévinas to such figures distorts his philosophy by importing philosophical concerns that could not have interested him when he wrote his works. However, such dialogue across philosophical traditions marks an important phase in his reception in the English-speaking philosophical community. One thinks here of the impact figures such as Heidegger and Merleau-Ponty have had in cognitive science. It is exciting that Lévinas is beginning to enjoy this type of reception in normative ethics and, with this collection, philosophy of law.

This is not to say that Essays on Lévinas and Law is flawless. I noted earlier that the essays contained in it were originally presented at a conference at McGill University. The resulting short, exploratory style of the pieces is at times a minor drawback, insofar as it makes the collection as a whole somewhat fragmentary. If there is a problem with the book, it is that it is currently too expensive to achieve the reach it deserves. The book is currently available in hardcover, for $85, which may be prohibitively expensive for students and researchers who do not have access to a well-funded research library. This flaw is not a criticism of the collection but rather a by-product of how academic publishers market their publications to academic libraries. Perhaps we can look forward to a paperback edition in the near future.