Ethics and Experience: Life Beyond Moral Theory

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Timothy Chappell, Ethics and Experience: Life Beyond Moral Theory, Acumen, 2009, 229pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780773536425.

Reviewed by Mark T. Nelson, Westmont College



It can be hard to find a good secondary text for an undergraduate “Intro to Ethics” course. It is not hard to find decent collections of primary readings, certainly, and there is no shortage of useful companions, dictionaries and encyclopedias about ethics. There are some good advanced treatments of metaethics, too, and of individual normative theories. What is hard to find is a textbook that introduces and explains both metaethics and normative ethical theory to beginners in a way that is clear and accessible without sacrificing breadth or philosophical depth. And some of the standard secondary texts that are reasonably accessible and thorough are, well, just a little tedious: rehearsing the same old arguments, the same old examples, the same old theories. If that has been your experience, then here is a book for you: Timothy Chappell’s Ethics and Experience: Life Beyond Moral Theory. It is as fresh and lucid an introduction to philosophical ethics as you are likely to find in a couple hundred pages: comprehensive and philosophically informed, but strikingly offbeat, even original. Perhaps the most striking feature of the book is the way it explains the rational appeal of many ethical theories, while pointing up their limitations, it points beyond them to an approach to ethics that de-thrones theory and does justice to both reason and experience.

One pedagogic virtue of the book is that it emphasizes the continuity of ethical thinking with the rest of philosophy. In Chapter One, Chappell defines philosophy as: “the use of reason to answer worldview-shaping questions” and ethics, in turn, as “the use of reason to answer the Socratic question ‘How should life be lived?’” (3). This definition, says Chappell, immediately throws up a number of crucial issues, which he calls:

The demarcation question. What makes something specifically an ethical concern? How do ethical concerns differ from other sorts of concern?

The why-be-moral question. Ethics makes demands on us that can be difficult or even dangerous to obey. When it does, what reason is there to obey these demands?

The question of reason. Is it right even to try to apply reason to the question “How should life be lived?”? If it is, what sort of reason?

The question of objectivity. Any assertion that “This is how life should be lived” prompts an obvious question: says who? What is the authority for any answer to the Socratic question, and how can we tell? (3)

The book begins with metaethics, then, and Chappell spends the next several chapters mapping the metaethical terrain. In Chapter Two, he briefly answers the demarcation question by stating what ethics is not (law, politics, emotion, religion, or the “personal”), and what it is: “Ethics is about what I should do as a human being” in my whole life (7). This characterization of ethics allows for pervasive and over-riding ethical demands, so in Chapter Three, Chappell takes up the why-be-moral question, in terms of the apparent conflict between the demands of living right and living well. Chappell briefly sketches the main normative theories that he will treat later (virtue ethics, utilitarianism, Kantianism, contractarianism), and shows that, on each of these theories, the demands of living right are in tension with our prospects for personal happiness and satisfaction. He memorably classifies the main ways philosophers have tried to resolve this tension as: “forget about living morally”, “forget about living well”, “a compromise is possible”, “pull living well up into living morally”, and “pull living morally down into living well”. (This is one of a number of places in the book where Chappell’s knack for explaining things made me think "I wish I’d thought of that.“) In Chapter Four, Chappell considers the question of reason, and whether it makes sense to reason about ethics at all. He canvasses a number of skepticisms about the role of reason in ethics (from Burke, Hume, Williams and Ayer), but concludes that we are not barred from arguing rationally about either means or ends. Here as elsewhere, Chappell does not confine himself to an impersonal inventory of the possibilities: he takes part in the argument himself. For what it’s worth, I found his interventions in the argument fair-minded and to the point, but readers wanting a wholly un-opinionated survey are advised to look elsewhere.

”NDPRBodyTexT">Chappell then takes three chapters to address a cluster of issues around objectivity. In Chapter Five, he introduces ethical subjectivism (“No ethical judgement is objectively true”) and a modest ethical objectivism (“At least some ethical judgements are objectively true”), and then considers arguments in favor of objectivism based on the apparent possibility of rational criticism, the phenomenology of our ethical thoughts as beliefs in facts and “default literalism” about moral language. In Chapter Six, Chappell canvasses five arguments in favor of subjectivism, based on: relativity, the is-ought gap, naturalism, Humean moral psychology, and Bernard Williams’s internal reasons. (Williams is something of a presence in the book, sometimes in the foreground, often in the background.) Chappell interprets them all as abductive arguments, to the effect that subjectivism, not objectivism, is the best explanation of these phenomena. He then systematically criticizes all of them as failing to describe the phenomena correctly or failing to show that the truth of subjectivism best explains them. There is nothing new about these five arguments, but Chappell’s interpretation of them as abductive arguments strikes me as novel and pedagogically effective. That said, his conclusion is modest: “The upshot of this chapter is that these [subjectivist] arguments do not succeed; unless a large number of apparently possible positions can be excluded from the argument, ethical objectivism remains a possible option” (72). In Chapter Seven, Chappell takes up a question that both the objectivist and subjectivist must address: “What is ethics about?”, meaning "What does ethical discourse say, since it seems to say something?" He considers and criticizes Blackburn’s expressivism, Mackie’s error theory, and standard divine command theory as accounts of the subject matter of ethics, and draws on his own previously published work to argue interestingly for a moral perceptualism, according to which ethics is about perceptions of real moral properties, but which is neither ontologically nor epistemologically extravagant. Chappell then turns to normative ethical theory.

In Chapter Eight through Eleven, Chappell explains virtue ethics, utilitarianism, Kantian deontology and contractarianism, respectively, as sample normative theories. I will not try to sketch each of these chapters, but I will note that Chappell’s explanations strike me as a nice balance between the familiar and the unfamiliar. They are philosophically responsible in that they get across the essentials of each theory, but do so in fresh and engaging ways. For example:

How should life be lived? At the heart of virtue ethics lies a simple but (when you unpack it) surprisingly powerful answer to this book’s basic question, which we can express in a two-word slogan: act naturally. This slogan is ambiguous. “Act naturally” can mean “act in accordance with nature”… . It can also mean “act spontaneously”. Virtue ethicists have both meanings in mind, and there is a good deal to say about both. (99)

Chappell uses the first reading to explain the “zoological” basis of much virtue theory:

If you want to know how life should be lived, then an obvious place to start is by thinking about what kind of creature you are, and what kind of life suits a creature like you: what kind of life satisfies the sort of needs (on the one hand) and goals (on the other) that creatures like you typically have.

For instance, if you are a blue whale the answer to “How should life be lived?” that works for you will include plenty of plankton, cool, deep unpolluted oceans, the company of other blue whales, and complete absence of Japanese fishing vessels. (100)

Chappell uses the second reading to explain the centrality of dispositions to virtue theory, and what he calls the “modularity of practical choice”:

The scope of a good person’s deliberation will often be radically narrower than a certain sort of moral theorist might be predisposed to imagine. Perhaps, in [the hospital visitation scenario] the good person will decide that it is a good idea to take a gift to his bedridden friend, and so have to decide whether he should take (a) chocolates, (b) grapes, © roses, or just (d) an amusingly vulgar card. But [in this scenario] there is also the possibility that the good person should take his friend (e) poisoned chocolates, or (f) exploding grapes, or (g) a dead badger, or (h) Trainspotter’s Weekly, and so on indefinitely… .

What the modularity of practical choice means is that a good person, as the virtue ethicist understands him, does not even need to raise the possibilities from (e) onwards for deliberation. If anyone else raises possibilities such as (e-h), he will treat them with the bemusement they deserve. (106)

Having surveyed the various normative theories on offer and the arguments for and against them, we might suppose that we are poised on the brink of a choice, and it remains only for us to decide which theory is most favored by reason. Chappell, however, refuses to make such a choice, and in Chapter Twelve he explains why. Chapter Twelve is the last and longest in the book, and is also (in my view) the most original. According to Chappell, each of the main moral theories has something going for it, but each also suffers from a distorting narrowness or tendency to “over-moralize”. These distortions are the inevitable product of a systematizing reason that ignores context, tries to be scientific and tries to capture everything, and generally aspires “to provide an explanation of rightness and wrongness that is both general and exclusive. In each case the claim is that moral theory explains every instance of rightness or wrongness, and explains them on its own” (185). This is a controversial idea, to be sure, but it certainly resonated with this reviewer. Just last semester, in an undergraduate course on “Moral Problems”, I found myself wondering why the ethical theories to which I had introduced my students shed so little light on the ethics of killing. Of course, act utilitarianism, rule utilitarianism, Kantian deontology, Rossian pluralism and Aristotelian virtue ethics had something to say about why killing was wrong, when it was wrong. But what they had to say was not much help in deciding, in any particular instance, whether killing would be wrong, or in plausibly explaining why it was, when it was. As explanations of why killing was wrong in particular instances, the theories either didn’t account for our considered-but-non-theoretical convictions that such killings would be wrong or they didn’t add anything to them. Chappell describes my experience with eerie accuracy, and adds:

there is one very basic and obvious point about murder that all of these moral theories seem to miss. This is that murder is not just a matter of treating someone badly, unjustly, unfairly or in a way that deprives them of goods (although it is that of course). In murder you do not so much take something away from someone as take away the someone; you deprive him, not of this or that good, but of himself, by destroying him. This seems to be the most central wrong involved in murder, and most moral theories remarkably enough, do not even get around to mentioning it. (210)

Instead of opting for irrationalism or quietism, he concludes:

I want to take seriously the suggestion that the kind of use of reason that we need to do ethics well — what we need to make best sense in answering Socrates’ question — is not the sort of use of reason characteristically involved in moral theory at all. It is something rather different to which I shall give the name of an ethical outlook.

This he characterizes as:

a set of views and commitments about the central questions concerning value: what is worth living for and what is worth dying for; what is really admirable and what is really contemptible; what we must do at all costs and what we must not do no matter what; and so on. This set of views and commitments need not be very explicit; but it must run deep — must be sincerely and indeed passionately held. And it need not be very systematic; but it must be as considered, rationally defensible and coherent as possible. (195)

Only this sort of thing, argues Chappell, can do justice to something as basic and central as love, so only this sort of thing can play the part in ethical motivation, explanation, deliberation and prediction that contemporary philosophers had previously expected theory to play. Chappell’s discussion here is suggestive and impressionistic; clearly, these are ideas under development, and it would be nice to hear more about the ways in which our ethical outlooks can reflect and be disciplined by reason, if they are indeed to count as an application of reason to Socrates’ question.

I hope it is clear, from what I have already said, that Chappell’s ideas in this book are interesting; they are also very well presented. As an author, he is very much present in the text and in the argument, and he is good company throughout. He writes clear, accessible prose, in a style that is brisk, witty and confident, occasionally even imperious. He illustrates each section with perfectly chosen epigraphs, ranging from Aristotle and Locke to Shakespeare and Keats to Groucho Marx and Douglas Adams. He ranges across the history of ethical thinking, from Socrates to Scanlon, understands it thoroughly and explains it well, with lots of amusing, off-beat examples. Though the tone is informal and engaging, the material is by no means simple, and the book perhaps would not be suitable for the timid undergraduate’s first course in philosophy. For an upper-year “Ethics” course that covers both metaethics and normative ethics, however, Timothy Chappell’s Ethics and Experience deserves serious consideration.