Ethics and Humanity: Themes from the Philosophy of Jonathan Glover

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N. Ann Davis, Richard Keshen, and Jeff McMahan (eds.), Ethics and Humanity: Themes from the Philosophy of Jonathan Glover, Oxford UP, 2010, 290pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195325195.

Reviewed by Gerald Lang, University of Leeds



Ethics and Humanity contains, in addition to Alan Ryan’s affectionate biographical portrait of him, eleven original essays on aspects of Jonathan Glover’s philosophical work, together with a set of replies by Glover. No elaborate case needs to be made for the importance of books such as Causing Deaths and Saving Lives, What Kind of People Should There Be?, and Humanity: A Moral History of the Twentieth Century; Glover is well deserving of a Festschrift. But what kind of philosopher had Glover become by the time he came to write Humanity, and what kind of departure does this book represent from his earlier work? These are questions which the essays in Ethics and Humanity encourage us to ask, and enable us to intelligently think about. Though its contributors occasionally engage with Glover’s other work, most of the essays deal, in one way or another, with issues covered by, connected to, or arising from, Humanity.

Reasons of space prevent me from substantive discussion of some of the essays in the volume. I won’t have anything further to say about Thomas Hurka’s important essay on Just War Theory’s treatment of consequences, Jeff McMahan’s penetrating essay on humanitarian intervention, or Onora O’Neill’s sensible attack on over-refinement in research ethics codes. (Glover is also sympathetic to the conclusions of these authors.) Similarly, I shall abstain from further comment on N. Ann Davis’s spirited polemical attack on the commodification of knowledge and research (though there was practically nothing in it with which I disagreed).

I start with some brief stage-setting. In Humanity, Glover looks principally at human practice or behaviour, rather than theory, paying particular attention to the major atrocities unleashed by the wars and dictators of the twentieth century, and to the psychology of the actors who participated in these atrocities. In explaining this sometimes grotesque behaviour, Glover thinks we need to appeal to factors which short-circuit people’s dispositions to respect the dignity of, or to show sympathy for, their victims, as well as factors which impede people’s usual determination to adhere to their ‘moral identity’ or their chosen self-description as morally conscientious beings. This is an important project, and Glover’s execution of it is both unflinching and admirably clear-minded. As it has been described so far, however, it needn’t be a hugely revisionary one for the style of normative theorizing to which we have become accustomed. At best, it might encourage an enlargement of the typical areas of study addressed by those who are interested in philosophical ethics, and a subsequent division of labour between traditional normative theorizing, which will continue to fix standards for action, practices, and institutions, largely unencumbered by facts about human psychology, and a more empirical study of actual human behaviour, which sets out to explain why we often — sometimes spectacularly — fall short of those standards, and to suggest ways in which those standards might get to be better entrenched in our behaviour.

This would be an important development, but in any case Glover’s ambition seems different. His aim is not only to enlarge the study of ethics by taking a closer look at the sources of moral frailty, but to make the content of ethics more empirical. What does this ambition really amount to? There are two components, or inputs. The first is metaethical. Glover is pessimistic about the possibility of an ‘external grounding’ for ethics and thinks that ethics must be largely constructed from people’s various attempts at self-creation, fortified and undergirded by the psychological deposits of sympathy and respect for others. The second component is more normative. While Causing Deaths and Saving Lives espoused utilitarianism and featured, in particular, an influential critique of the common sense doctrine that acts and omissions enjoy an asymmetrical moral significance, Glover now seems more willing to take deontological intuitions seriously, favouring a Rawlsian ‘reflective equilibrium’ between principle and intuition. Glover’s overall idea, then, seems to be that moral standards are constructed from the psychological facts — presumably idealized in certain ways — and that they lack an independent life. So it is not terribly clear where we would end up even if the idealized conditions were in place, which of course they are not. I will return to this point below.

The metaethical themes are taken up by Roger Crisp’s succinct and powerfully argued essay. For Crisp, the main advantage of the existence of an external grounding for ethics is that it would furnish us with desire-independent external reasons, not just desire-dependent internal reasons, for acting in morally appropriate ways. We would then be in the happy position to say, as Crisp puts it, that “the world — indeed any world — is such that no one should inflict severe suffering on others for the sake of their own trivial pleasure” (p. 178). In his replies, Glover professes dissatisfaction with Crisp’s objectivist picture. He is unable to see how the world’s being such as to give us overriding reasons for not unnecessarily inflicting suffering on others can play any concrete role in demonstrating that we have such reasons (p. 269).

To this criticism, Crisp might retort that he is simply describing the conviction that our reasons for refraining from inflicting unnecessary suffering should not be held hostage to whatever psychological foibles we happen to have and that we need an account of ethics which can satisfy this conviction. Glover’s reply, I think, will be that nothing can be achieved without the right psychology and that moral metaphysics can’t help to deliver the right psychology. That might be true as far as human behaviour goes, but it does not, by itself, satisfy our expectation that other creatures’ interests are such as to merit our sympathy and respect, thereby giving us reasons to treat them in morally decent ways, whatever our desires might happen to be. Glover’s official metaethical position is a constructivist or response-dependent one, where we somehow construct moral standards through dialogue, as opposed to discovering an already existing morality. But my suspicion, reading between the lines, is that Glover might be equally happy to follow the example of Ronald Dworkin and adopt a version of metaethical quietism, where no metaphysical worries about ethical foundations need be entertained, and where normative theorizing, however it is supposed to unfold, is not held hostage to any news, good or otherwise, appearing on the metaethical front. (Of course, quietism is open to several further objections, but in certain respects it appears to fit Glover’s commitments pretty well.)

This is not to say that Crisp is optimistic about the prospects for an objectivist account of ethics. What perplexes him, in particular, is an epistemological worry about non-convergence, or what he calls the ‘consensus condition’ on moral knowledge (p. 179). How can we continue to believe that the ethical realm is objective if convergence fails to emerge among interlocutors who take themselves, and each other, to be reasonable? Perhaps we would be entitled to dismiss opposition to certain basic claims, such as the claim, mentioned above, that we should not inflict unnecessary suffering on others for trivial gains in pleasure (which Crisp labels claim C), on the grounds that such opposition could only be the product of normative egoism, which is itself a deeply controversial view. But Crisp thinks that non-adherents to C could seek refuge in, not normative egoism, but what he calls the ‘self-interest principle’ (p. 180), which makes self-interested courses of action merely pro tanto reason-giving. I wasn’t convinced by this move in Crisp’s argument. If the self-interest principle is less controversial than normative egoism, it is because the pro tanto reason-giving character of self-interested courses of action is weighed against the reason-giving character of other, non-self-interested courses of action. From the implicit admission that there are reason-giving non-self-interested courses of action in addition to reason-giving self-interested courses of action, it is surely plausible to conclude that anyone who refused to endorse C wouldn’t deserve to be counted as reasonable. Even if we could achieve reasonable consensus on a claim such as C, however, there would surely be stiffer challenges ahead, and Crisp’s pessimism about surmounting these challenges might yet be justified.

Glover describes himself as being “less dismayed” than Crisp is by the prospect of non-consensus, because he is not concerned about success or failure in tracking an independent moral reality (p. 270). But there is still something for him to be worried about. If our moral standards are constructed largely by dialogue between reasonable interlocutors, then that process of construction will be subverted by intractable disagreement. A further but related problem is that, in a case of what seems to be intractable disagreement between you and me, where each of us thinks of ourselves as reasonable, and regards the other as reasonable, there is going to be some pressure on each of us either to withdraw confidence in our own reasonableness, or to withdraw confidence in the other person’s reasonableness. These worries about reasonable disagreement are explored in Richard Keshen’s interesting essay. Keshen is pessimistic that this problem can be satisfactorily solved. Part of his diagnosis of intractable disagreement between interlocutors who seem, on the surface, to be reasonable, is that their interpretation of evidence, and their conception of what even counts as evidence, is bound to be influenced by deep background biographical factors, or what he calls the “Life Experience Condition” (p. 134). As Keshen seems to realize, however, the Life Experience Condition does not leave everything where it is. We would then need to inquire into the type of relevance which biographical background endows upon the proper interpretation of evidence. Though the debate will then have become a more abstract one, it won’t have ground to a halt completely, and the hope of further progress can be defensibly entertained.

In his essay, Allen Buchanan criticizes Glover for neglecting the influence of institutions in the shaping of our moral beliefs. Buchanan recommends the more thoroughgoing adoption of a ‘social moral epistemology’, in which we pay attention to the institutional conditions under which moral beliefs are arrived at, rather than pouring all our energy into theorizing in the more traditional, relatively free-standing way. Much of what Buchanan has to say is sensible and insightful, but I think he over-reaches himself when he suggests that, “if a [moral] belief would be fostered and sustained by epistemically sound institutions, this is itself a reason (not necessarily a conclusive reason) for thinking that the belief is justified” (p. 124), for there must still be independent normative standards which can ratify the doxastic outputs of epistemically sound institutions as justified.

Crisp and, at greater length, Peter Singer discuss what may seem, at first blush, to be a strange omission from the pages of Humanity: namely, its failure to mention our culpable failure to assist the distant needy. Singer reminds us that around 18 million people are estimated to die from poverty-related causes each year (p. 187). It is admitted on all sides that we could do much more about this than we do at the moment. Most moderately good people want to be at peace with their consciences, as Glover suggests in Humanity. But if acts are put on a par with omissions, then we will have much more to feel guilty about than we presently think we do. On this picture, our failure to assist the distant needy will be no better than ordinary murder. But another way of describing this epiphany is that ordinary murder will be no worse than our failure to assist the distant needy. At that point, and given the fact that most of us tend to want to be at peace with our consciences, it seems to be partly an empirical matter how the re-equilibration of conscience will go. Will we endeavour to meet the standards of a more demanding morality, or will the particular act-based prohibitions suffer some sort of erosion of respect? This is an empirical question, and we can’t answer it fully from the philosopher’s armchair. It is clearly Glover’s hope that we do much more than we presently do to alleviate the suffering of the distant poor. But a theory, such as Singer’s, which suggests that any well-fed person with an undonated surplus is no better than a murderer isn’t going to mesh with many of the other things Glover cares about, and wishes to uphold.

Two of the essays, by John Harris and Martha Nussbaum, respectively, are concerned with the connection between humans and animals. Their concerns are rather different. Nussbaum pursues two lines of thought. The first of them concerns the human tendency to withhold sympathy for suffering in cases where we attribute fault or blame to those who are suffering. As Nussbaum rightly points out, these attributions of blame are frequently erroneous and self-serving, and we don’t encounter such faults (because we don’t encounter any attributions of blame at all) in animals. (Typical example: poor people are blamed for being workshy or irresponsible, thereby conveniently releasing the rest of us from the duty of relieving their condition.) The lesson to be drawn from these cases, however, is that we need to arrive at more sensitive attributions of blame, not that such attributions need to cease altogether. (Going on what she has to say, I don’t think Nussbaum would disagree.) Nussbaum’s second line of argument is concerned with the phenomenon of ‘anthropodenial’, or the tendency that some humans have displayed to deny their animal condition, a condition which is described at one point as being “too dirty, too mortal, too decaying” to be easily accepted (p. 220). Anthropodenial often takes the form of aggressive violence, in which a conviction in one’s invulnerability or power is upheld by dominating a group of other humans who are stigmatised as “the shameful ones, the weak ones” (p. 216). Nussbaum illustrates her thesis with the horrifying example of the pogrom in Gujarat, India, in 1992, in which Hindu mobs massacred 2,000 Muslim civilians, raping and torturing, with metallic phallic instruments, many Muslim women along the way.

Crucial to Nussbaum’s account is the mechanism of scapegoating. We look for opportunities to demonize other humans — Muslim women, in the case of the Hindu rapists and murderers in Gujarat in 1992 — in order to reassure ourselves that we are free of the troubling vulnerability and dependencies of the human condition to which they, by contrast, are clearly heir. Even if Nussbaum is right to suggest that these mechanisms obtain, it is plausible to suppose that other enabling or contributing conditions (well covered in Glover’s Humanity), concerning political rivalry, tribal attachment, tit-for-tat reprisals, and so on, will often be additional presences in situations where violence is unleashed. But notice, in any case, how distinctly human all these traits are, and how distinctly human the remedies for them must be. Most of what Nussbaum has to say in this essay, however insightful, could have been said without drawing on any extensive comparisons with the behaviour of non-human animals.

Harris’s characteristically provocative essay explores the category of ‘humanimals’, or human-animal hybrids. He points out that work on humanimals can proceed on two levels: on a microscopic level, in which human cells are mixed with animal cells, but in which any resulting embryos are not brought to full term; and a macroscopic level, in which such embryos are permitted to come to full term, and enjoy lives as living independent creatures. Work at the microscopic level, though not the macroscopic level, is already under way. Harris’s self-appointed task is to build a case for the creation for humanimals as fully fledged independent creatures.

Harris actually suggests at one point that we humans are already humanimals, due to our ancestry from apes (pp. 161-2). Fine: but the problem is that, in order to even state his argument, Harris needs some form of contrast between humans and animals; he needs this contrast in order to be able to recommend its gradual and partial dissolution. We should presumably understand humanimals, then, as human-like creatures in whom the proportion between hitherto-unfamiliar-animal-genetic-material and already-existing-human-genetic-material has been increased.

Two important questions are raised by Harris’s argument. First, why exactly would the creation of humanimals provoke outrage? (Harris clearly thinks they will; indeed, as I will discuss shortly, he is banking on the fact they will.) The answer is not terribly clear, particularly if the resulting humanimals don’t look obviously part-human, part-animal — if, that is, and as Harris recommends, the ‘mermaid myth’ is left aside (p. 158) — and if we have already settled for various animal incursions into our bodies, whether through diet, heart valves, or the common ape-descended human genetic inheritance. Second, why would we want humanimals to be around in any case? The micro-humanimal laboratory work already in progress serves therapeutic purposes. But Harris is exploring the possibility of bringing humanimals as fully independent creatures into existence. Harris does not (I am tentatively assuming) envisage using such creatures as living organ banks. Harris gives us rather little to work with here, but there seem to be two ideas. The first idea is that humanimals would represent impersonal (rather than person-affecting) improvements in the overall quality of lives in existence (pp. 160-1). Another way of accomplishing this same aim, of course, would be simply to (painlessly) kill all existing animals in order to create more room for a much larger human population, most of whom would tend, as human persons, to occupy a higher tier of well-being than non-human animals. One doesn’t have to be a radical environmentalist to balk at this proposal. Harris’s second idea is that the “circumstances of confusion” (p. 166) resulting from the creation of humanimals would have an eventually salutary effect on our moral thinking about moral status and biological nature. But more, surely, has to be said in support of the deliberate creation of humanimals than that their existence would provoke outrage — if, that is, they would provoke outrage — therefore licensing Harris and others to trot out all the usual arguments about the indefensibility of speciesism and the baselessness of ‘yuck’ responses. In truth, Harris says very little to substantiate his claim that it is “almost imperative” (p. 166) that we create humanimals; it seems to be closer to an idle fancy than to an imperative.

I turn, in closing, to James Griffin’s essay on torture which opens the volume, and to which Glover devotes the longest reply. Griffin is undecided about the status of torture and is admirably candid about this indecision. Though he shares the revulsion that most of us will feel at acts of torture, he thinks that the possibility of a case for ‘principled torture’ cannot be ruled out in advance, given both the possibility of ‘ticking bomb’ scenarios and also (what seems to him to be) the structurally similar fact that, in self-defence cases, victims can permissibly counter-attack aggressors. If, assuming the proportionality and necessity conditions are met, I may kill in self-defence someone who is trying to poison me, then why can’t I choke the poisoner in order to get him to tell me the antidote I need? (p. 9) Griffin is defeated by the attempt to arrive at a clear solution to his problem, given our “near invincible ignorance” of the consequences of instituting a policy of selective principled torture.

In his reply to Griffin, Glover acknowledges the challenges but argues for the removal of torture as a policy option, chiefly out of a concern for its abuse and its corrosive effects on individual moral character and on the wider political and public culture. But another way of questioning Griffin’s position is to question the analogy between self-defence and torture. There may be morally relevant differences between killing someone who is attempting to poison me (where I can only save myself by killing him) and torturing him to force him to give me the antidote. Using the terms which have emerged in the literature, in the first case I am dealing with the poisoner as a ‘culpable attacker’, and in the second case I am dealing with him as a ‘culpable cause’. When I kill the poisoner in self-defence, I do not use him to gain something I couldn’t gain without him, but when I torture him to force him to give me the antidote, I perhaps do. Many recent theorists of self-defence — Helen Frowe and Jonathan Quong, to name two of them — have thought that this distinction between ‘eliminative’ agency and ‘manipulative’ agency is a morally significant one. In any case, the distinction might help to shed further light on these difficult issues.

Ethics and Humanity is a distinguished collection of essays which will be required reading for anyone with interests in normative or applied ethics, or indeed anyone who has ever wondered why human beings are capable of doing all the terrible things they have done to each other.