Ethics and the Business of Biomedicine

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Denis G. Arnold (ed.), Ethics and the Business of Biomedicine, Cambridge UP, 2009, 291pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521748223.

Reviewed by Lisa Newton, Fairfield University



Let me begin with some disclaimers and disclosures of interest.

I have been proclaiming for years that such a book should be written. Denis Arnold and the contributors to this volume are surely among the best in the field, and picking up the book, I was sure that my effort in reviewing would be well rewarded. I was not disappointed. Arnold has managed to create a reunion of the first two fields of practical (applied, professional) ethics, biomedical ethics and business ethics, with all the drama of the dilemmas, and with no pretense at solutions.

In the introduction (unsigned; presumably by Arnold) the problem underlying its investigation is set out very clearly: the recent move of the professions of health care from a service orientation to market orientation. The price of health care has risen dramatically, consuming ever larger portions of the GDP, especially in the United States. Is this right? Is this just? These questions cannot be addressed without calling on the disciplines of bioethics and business ethics to work together, and as Arnold points out, they are seldom in conversation.

But scholars of both disciplines were apparently given the common task

to evaluate the practices of profit-seeking healthcare organizations, and business-friendly public policies regarding health care, and to offer normative guidance regarding the ethical delivery of healthcare products and services by profit-seeking organizations operating in a global marketplace. (p. 1)

Full stop. From the point of view of traditional bioethics, we have already trespassed over several lines. What’s this “profit-seeking healthcare organization” we’re supposed to take seriously? Is it anything like our local profit-seeking evangelical church whose pastor just went off for several years in jail? If health care seeks profit, it will surely find it — there’s nothing we want so much as freedom from pain and a long active life, and to the extent that we have money, we’ll pay the earth to get them. People without money will not be able to get them, of course, but then they can’t get expensive sports cars, either, and we don’t mourn over that. Is health care radically different from sports cars, or even music lessons? If not, whence the controversy? And if it is different, then maybe pursuit of profit is totally alien to the profession.

Where is the baseline, the position from which we move when we try to bring the practice of medicine up to date? Edmund Pellegrino has always maintained that the heart of medicine is the physician-patient encounter, where the physician, drawing upon his scientific knowledge and experience with healing, helps the patient to make decisions that will aid his return to health. The physician’s entire attention is focused on the patient’s welfare. Alternative agendas — money, political advantage, whatever - are strictly ruled out of the decision making process, regarded as alien intrusions - viruses — infecting the practice of medicine.

Those of us with a history in the field find ourselves faced with a new vocabulary. “Healthcare” is a new word. We’ve been talking about the ethics of medicine for centuries, and since Hippocrates we have known that medicine could be practiced for disproportionate material rewards. In Sinclair Lewis’ Main Street, the tale of a physician’s wife in a small Midwestern town early in the 20th century, disapproving mention is made of one of the town physicians, who makes a few too many visits to the sick he attends, to gather a few more fees. The actual status of the physician of beloved memory, the general practitioner in small town America of the first half of the 20th century, closely parallels the status of the college professor in that time, a life of genteel poverty. Why? They probably knew how to make their profession more profitable, but, unlike the “Park Avenue doctor,” who specialized, in the words of the immortal Tom Lehrer, in “diseases of the rich,” they elected not to. Most physicians in independent practice now make the same choice. When they choose otherwise, we have the case of McAllen, Texas, charging Medicare much more than comparable areas for procedures that do not apparently improve the health of the patients. But what is “healthcare,” in relation to medicine? Can “healthcare” be practiced for profit?

The challenge that Arnold presented to his writers, then, was controversial at its heart. To give the book a fair review, I will have to set aside for the moment the argument — with which I have a certain amount of sympathy — of those who feel that fundamental corruption is shown in the asking of his question. Arnold is on the crest of the wave of the future, and he has done a very good job of assembling its controversies and dilemmas. I’ll come back to that fundamental corruption.

I will begin with the contributions I found easiest to deal with, because that fundamental question does not reside at their hearts. Seven essays address the pharmaceutical industry and the dilemmas raised by its entanglements with health care providers and scientific research. The essays include: Paul Menzel’s on patents (is the protection of intellectual property justified in the face of intractable disease among the developing nations?); Tom Beauchamp’s on the tendency to exploit the disadvantaged in pharmaceutical research (who, after all, is going to become a “healthy normal volunteer” for the trial regimens?); Jason Hubbard’s on the notorious corruption of the medical profession in the practices of pharmaceutical marketing (“detailing”); Denis Arnold’s on the ramifications of “direct to consumer” marketing, (an excellent survey of the types of pharmaceutical marketing to consumers and the regulations supposedly governing them — pointing out, among other criticisms, that the warnings of adverse effects are nowhere carried out with the precision that the law is assumed to demand); Carl Elliott’s consideration of the role of industry-sponsorship in bioethics committee and IRB review — industry sponsorship of IRB review?! (he suggests that there should be no financial ties between those who serve on such committees and the industries interested in their results — and where there are such ties, they should be cut); and Richard DeGeorge’s solid, if qualified, praise for the pharmaceutical industry. I find these essays excellent, and the problems they call attention to real, yet not fundamental to the problem of the book. At bottom, the pharmaceutical industry is a business, falling well within the purview of business ethics. Those of us who have been in business ethics for some years recognize the problems (the practice in question: harms consumers or the community; is a conflict of interest or at least appears to be such; violates law, harms the environment, or otherwise intrudes on the public). We know how to recognize and suggest appropriate remedies (the industry must be forbidden by law to engage in certain practices, or must employ means to disclose fully the nature of the product or the processes by which it is marketed; all deceptive practices must be stopped). As long as there is not a real human being, sick and in need of care, in the picture, we are on solid ground.

The most ominous of these essays, by Dan Wikler, explores the invasion of medical education and practice by the pharmaceutical industry and by all makers of medical devices that need government approval and professional acceptance to become profitable. He demonstrates, more thoroughly than I would have thought possible, the entangling corruption of the medical profession, a state that he finds to be on the brink of the utter destruction of our trust in our physicians. He comes closest to the deep wound of commercial involvement found in Arnold’s initial question, and is sufficiently alarmed to call for a new review of all medical education and practice, a “Flexner II” that will recommend sweeping reforms for the entire profession. I’ll get back to Flexner II at the end of the review.

This volume taps the long-standing ethics expertise of many of those mentioned above. Of its eleven essays, the first is by Dan Callahan himself, “Medicine and the Market,” in which he undertakes to find a sensible framework for the “medicine market debate,” so that we can at least argue intelligently about it. The anger of the old school medical ethicists (Edmund Pellegrino, Arnold Relman) at the commercialism of current practice has to be set against the inevitable rise in the costs of health care and the need for institutions outside individual medical practices to provide the efficiency, quality, and cost control demanded by the public. Callahan correctly identifies the central division on the question of health care as a conflict of values. On the individual level, does freedom/autonomy (the consumer’s preference and choice) trump beneficence/welfare (the consumer’s health and long life)? Is it right for me to indulge my taste for hamburgers, candy and beer, as my Type II diabetes worsens? And then, does the collective freedom of hamburgers, etc. trump the collective interest in keeping health care costs down? Callahan briefly examines the costs, and results, of health care in the US and in other developed countries, concluding, as have many others, that we seem to get less bang for the buck than we have every right to expect, noting the different habits of thought that divide us from the rest of the world. Europe, for instance, does not share our enthusiasm for advances in medical technology, responsible for up to 50% of our cost increases. Callahan concludes with the observation that the free-market rewards many practices, but not the promotion of human health. If health is what we want (and it is not clear that it is), the practices of the market must be subordinated to the goal of universal health care. Right now we have few ways of doing that.

Norm Daniels, whose contribution immediately follows Callahan’s, has been evaluating health care systems through the value of justice for (he estimates) three decades now. His unsurprising conclusion is that market practices, general and specific, have not turned out to be and will not turn out to be compatible with justice. In the course of transforming healthcare, he argues, the arrival of profit-oriented institutions has been eased by the promises they made when they arrived. Examples of this include: that the onset of competition among healthcare providers would lower unit costs and save a lot of money (just as competition among handheld calculators in the early 1970s resulted in vastly lower prices for each); that competition among health plans would lower the cost of health insurance; that high-deductible healthcare plans would cause more rational purchasing and lower costs; that competition among drug plans would lower the cost overall; and finally, Daniels throws in the promise that the introduction of user fees and reliance on the private sector in developing nations would lower costs for the poorest people in the world. All these promises have been broken, he shows, leaving us with an unworkable healthcare system characterized by gross injustices. A lesson to be learned: it costs a for-profit entity nothing to make promises as vague and unsecured as the promises he cites, and there is no penalty for breaking them. Do we have any institutional way of making sure promises are kept? I don’t think so.

One of the more significant essays in the book is “The Third Face of Medicine: Ethics, Business and Challenges to Professionalism,” by Mary Rorty, Patricia Werhane, and Ann Mills. This trio has been arguing for the importance of “organizational ethics,” a field that combines business ethics and bioethics, for some years. For a while we were able to maintain a journal of that title. It never caught on; possibly it was premature.

Or possibly its fundamental idea was incoherent. This essay is most useful for incorporating in its body the confusions that it accurately identifies. The authors point out in the first paragraphs that the new struggles with cost control threaten to displace the historical commitments of the physician to the welfare of the individual patient and to the progress of medical science through clinical research. (The analogy between the conflict of commitments embodied in the recruitment of patients, or people who at least thought they were patients, into clinical trials as research subjects, and the conflict embodied in the practice of “medicine” for physician profit, does not work.) They accurately track the corporatization of medicine, from the solo practice to the enormous complexity of the contemporary surgical suite, the enormous growth of the for-profit enterprises in the industry (and their triumph after the failure of the Clinton Health Care plan of the 1990s). They correctly point out that “market” mechanisms, premised on the freedom of every consumer to make “his own” choices and take full responsibility for them, do not fit the provision of health care in the U.S. now. The worst confusion, they point out, is in what they call the “bifurcation” of the health care consumer, where the employer (or the government) makes the purchases for unknown consumers, while the patient and physician, who may or may not be employed by the insurer, make the treatment decisions. They do not use the category of “moral hazard” to describe this condition, but it fits the definition: the person choosing to take the risks, or incur the costs, will not have to pay for the consequences. At some points they seem to recognize that the purpose of a for-profit enterprise is to make money, to arrange for income to exceed costs by a margin that will satisfy investors, and that this legal responsibility must trump concern for “quality of care” in all such enterprises. In the end, however, they come back to the belief that the for-profit enterprises can be “disciplined” into adopting goals aligned with traditional medical practice. They do not establish this belief, and their Stakeholder diagrams do not help. (If anything, the diagrams seem designed to show that the whole field of health care is much too complex to understand rationally. It is not.)

Is healthcare — the term that has replaced “the practice of medicine” — to be understood as a complex of profit-seeking institutions, individual and corporate, or as professional service, oriented to the health of the individual? In an interesting essay aimed at reconciling the two approaches, George Khushf characterizes the “traditional biomedical approach” not as the physician-patient encounter, but as the depersonalized practice represented by machines and tubes, invading the patient as object, identified as a case, not a person. He traces the rise of mechanical medicine to the Flexner Report, claiming that its emphasis on scientific medicine turned patients into things, and encouraged physicians to practice “paternalism,” making all decisions for the patient, since only they knew the mechanics of the body. (Khushf characterizes the traditional biomedical model as it was exemplified by Michael Bayles in his paper, “Disease as Mechanical Breakdown, Physicians as Body Mechanics,” delivered in London, Western Ontario, in the 1970s. The problematic rise of fragmentation of medical care came from the same insistence on science and the object; I do carburetors, not transmissions.) The bioethics response to such mechanical ways of looking at medicine re-emphasized the traditional understanding, and demanded a higher level of personal communication and concern. Paul Ramsey (The Patient as Person) and Eric Cassell (The Healer’s Art), along with the continuing work of Edmund Pellegrino, typified the resistance to such mechanism. The insistence on patient autonomy, represented by the demand for informed consent to all medical procedures, came out of this counter movement. So far so good; that opposition was there.

But the alternative to the mechanical model, advanced by those traditionalists, was a medical encounter characterized by a greater appreciation of human suffering and the patient’s own values, to moderate the aggressive imposition of treatments by a newly confident scientific medicine. Khushf takes such discussions as “micro-ethical,” making bioethics complicit with the Flexnerian model of “scientific” medicine, citing as evidence the rejection of Leon Kass’s work by the bioethics community as “unscientific.” (The rejections of Leon Kass’s work that I am familiar with do not call him unscientific, they call him wrong. Possibly just ultraconservative, but anyway wrong.) Khushf suggests that the remedy for the insulated scientific model is not even approached by contemporary bioethics, which he takes to be, following Jonathan Imber, the “Public Relations branch of modern medicine.” As evidence of the failure, he cites the SUPPORT study, which signally failed to improve, or even change, the practices of hospitals, practices that were in violation of informed consent and hospital policy. After a brief survey of the 1980s work of George Engel to re-conceive medicine as “”SpellE">biopsychosocial," which had, in his view, at least the merit of bringing society back into the picture, he then urges an integration of Engel with the “systems approach” of the IOM proposals of the 1990s. The normative agenda of organizational ethics requires a systems approach. But ways of constructing ethics are dependent on the dominant view of medicine, meaning that “The altered material conditions of medicine ”SpellE">problematize not just medicine, but these dominant traditions of ethics."

Khushf concludes that healthcare is now practiced not by individuals but by institutions; therefore, we must understand health holistically. Healthcare is broader than medicine, and works toward the health of communities. As a result, there is a new dialectic between normative and scientific aspects of healthcare. We have moved away from the “doctor-patient” dyad, to the “healthcare institution-patient population” dyad, away from the paradigm of the patient’s search for a “cure” and into the larger arena of institutional “care.”

I wish I understood what he has in mind. If all he means is that blaming individuals for errors in treatment is not worthwhile, and that we must seek institutional means (like checklists — you must read Atul Gawande’s New Yorker article on Peter Pronovost, and on the way checklists save lives) to improve health care, that’s fine. But if he means that institutional goals and priorities must take the place of the old medical priorities, I would note that most of the institutions now involved in healthcare have the priority of making money, and I tremble to think where medicine will go from here.

Let me try to pinpoint the major incongruity in the business/healthcare topic. In the manner of all other animals, we are born generally healthy, and if we have food and shelter supplied in the natural way, we will stay healthy until something happens (germs, falls, tumors, etc.) to damage that state. We all have grandfathers (Arnold is a different generation, so maybe I generalize inaccurately) who worked all their lives, and boasted that they had never seen a doctor. Unless you need to, there’s no reason to. Health is natural; healthcare is not. And you never had to pay a penny for that health. Matter of fact, what you have to do to preserve that health doesn’t cost anything either — don’t smoke, don’t eat candy or fast food, walk to work — in fact, they save money. So where does “healthcare insurance” figure in?

Contrast the clearer case of fire insurance. If you own a home, you paid a lot of money for it; that was a major investment. It makes sense to insure that investment, hence fire insurance. If you have a fire, the insurance should give you enough money to rebuild or replace. If you have no insurance, you are out every penny, without recourse. You have to pay the whole amount for a new home out of current income or savings. Fires are few and far between, so fire insurance does not cost very much. The whole arrangement makes sense.

But none of that makes sense for health. There was no investment, and unless evil things happen, there is no maintenance. You have no way of knowing how much (if any) insurance you will need, for you cannot put a price on your health and life (since you paid nothing to acquire them), even if you could foresee the future insults to your health, which you can’t. For those who argue globally that the price of healthcare is “too high,” there is a global answer: for the entire history of the human race, we have passionately desired freedom from pain and a long active life, for ourselves. We can’t pay “too much” to have these. By a small extension, we want the same for friends, family, and, I’d wager, long-term patients. After life and health and painlessness, we want money. If the money comes at the expense of our own, or our friends’ pain, or death, it’s no go; life is worth more. But if it comes at the expense of a stranger’s pain, some anonymous faraway person, we have traditionally seen no moral problem. Now that we are civilized, we are supposed to be ruled by charity and mercy, for the stranger as well as for our own, but the business system was not set up to be so ruled. What the current healthcare/insurance system does is import the “moral hazard” noted above to the entirety of dealings with patients. If we are an insurance company contemplating the effects of our policies and practices, we don’t care about the pain they produce, or countenance, and as long as we have investors scanning the quarterly returns, it is impossible that we should. Has anyone raised the suggestion that the entirety of healthcare should be consigned to the third sector, supported by individual payments as possible, and by taxes as necessary, but under the governance of not-for-profit institutions? If not, let me be the first.

I promised I’d get back to Dan Wikler and his proposed “Flexner II.” This might be a good way to finish this review: We need a thorough re-evaluation of the practice of medicine (or “healthcare”) of every description, to separate it from the profit machines of the insurance industry, to re-orient patient care toward the health of the patient, and just possibly, to lay out a plan to keep people healthy with many, many fewer medical interventions. I think that Flexner II would be a very good idea.