Ethics and the Global Financial Crisis: Why Incompetence is Worse than Greed

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Boudewijn de Bruin, Ethics and the Global Financial Crisis: Why Incompetence is Worse than Greed, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 228pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107028913.

Reviewed by Pietro Maffettone, Durham University


It is fair to say that the 2008 financial crisis has attracted a great deal of academic interest. Explanations of its causes range from deficient regulatory structures, to conflicts of interest, economic imbalances due to trade and capital liberalization, and the increased reliance on access to credit as a panacea for the deterioration of middle-income families' balance sheets (see Davies, 2010 for an accessible overview).

Concerns over the ethical problems raised by the crisis have also abounded: tales of greed, impropriety, and moral hazard have dominated news programs and parliamentary hearings. However, proper philosophical interventions into the debate have been limited (of course there are exceptions; see, for example, Lomasky, 2010). Boudewijn de Bruin's excellent book is thus a welcome addition to the literature on the crisis. His analysis adds a new twist to the ethical appraisal of the Great Recession: incompetence and the associated lack of epistemic virtue may have been, de Bruin suggests, the worst ethical failings in the financial services industry and, to some extent, one that can also be imputed to consumers themselves.

From a holistic point of view, the book's main achievement is to highlight the role and relevance of epistemic virtues in financial markets. The book's contribution can also be broken down into several constituent parts. Firstly, it deepens the link between ethics and epistemology. Secondly, it applies virtue epistemology to the world of business organizations and market participants (including consumers). Thirdly, it enhances our understanding of the role that virtue ethics can have when it comes to collective agents. Fourthly, it joins together, in an innovative way, the ethical evaluation of the crisis with a concern for the explanation of the crisis itself. Finally, the book draws on the author's longstanding interest in financial markets and provides an empirically informed piece of applied philosophy through the analysis of several case studies.

De Bruin starts from what we can call a minimalist account of the ethical obligations of corporations and a broadly libertarian pro-economic freedom normative view. The first is compatible with Milton Friedman's famous slogan that the role of business in society is to generate profits for its shareholders. The second starting point highlights the importance of freedom of choice in promoting personal responsibility and implies a strong commitment in favour of economic liberalization.

Once these initial normative commitments are in place, the book's argument delves into the meaning and role of epistemic virtues. The book provides a discussion of the virtues themselves. In many respects, we find a familiar list ranging from courage to temperance, generosity, justice and love. The book also defends the idea that epistemic virtues are genuine virtues insofar as we can depict belief formation as a form of acting. Furthermore, the book develops an original way of applying the idea of epistemic virtues to collective agents, something that seems clearly relevant given the importance of corporations in markets in general and in financial markets in particular. Finally, de Bruin takes sides in the longstanding debate on the importance of outcomes for the attribution of virtue. Here, he finds both practical and theoretical reasons to side with those who downplay the importance of successful outcomes.

While all the aforementioned points are developed in ways that do not simply replicate existing discussions, de Bruin's central theoretical contribution lies elsewhere, namely in his understanding of epistemic virtues as instrumentally rather than intrinsically valuable. At least as far as market participants are concerned, epistemic virtues are required to gather knowledge for purposes other than the acquisition of knowledge itself. This, de Bruin argues, both makes better sense of how individuals approach market exchanges and defeats the elitist temptations and pitfalls of virtue epistemology. The instrumental view of epistemic virtues also allows de Bruin to partially relax the justificatory requirements attached to our search for knowledge: given that the latter is only instrumentally valuable, market participants can often be content with less than justified true belief (i.e., the traditional explication of knowledge) and still be seen as virtuous. The connection between these two ideas is in a way disarmingly simple and yet ingenuous: if epistemic virtues are instrumentally valuable, then, the aspiration to acquire knowledge needs to be traded against the goals that such knowledge would allow market participants to realize: I can decide to spend the next twenty years trying to determine with certainty which is the best mortgage available in the market, but that would be self-defeating if the choice of a mortgage is instrumental to have a home and having my family live in it in the near future.

De Bruin's analysis would be commendable for no other reason than that it is able to highlight how many have clearly misinterpreted Friedman's view: even in a minimalist account of business ethics, one in which profit-making is central, firms should work within the limits of the law and prevailing social norms. In this respect de Bruin echoes authors such as Joseph Heath (2014), and is able to highlight the fact that what we can call a 'capitalist all the way down' approach to business ethics is not necessarily one that would be sympathetic to the Gordon Gekkos of this world. In a slogan: greed is good, sometimes and under specific circumstances. In a similar fashion, de Bruin also highlights that once one is in the business of promoting choice and responsibility, then, one has to accept demanding obligations pertaining to the promotion of epistemic virtues. Here the slogan could be: you can only be free and responsible if you know what you are doing. Responsibly exercised negative freedom requires positively aware citizens. Both slogans are, alas, less catchy than some of the more crude alternatives that are often voiced. Nonetheless, they are clearly much more plausible.

Some may be initially deterred by the clear normative standpoints articulated through these opening commitments. This reviewer, for example, is a Rawlsian of social democratic persuasions, and thus very far from the ideological framework of the book. However, this would be the wrong reaction. Firstly, de Bruin is aware that these are starting points -- they work more as axioms rather than theorems in his approach -- and so the reader is spared what would have otherwise been lengthy defences of them. Instead, what one gets are interesting and original explanations and elucidations. Even a moderate amount of interpretive charity should allow the reader to see that this approach makes the book more readable, and thus 'better' than it would have otherwise been. Secondly, de Bruin claims that his target is not simply other academics, but the broader audience constituted by policy makers and members of the financial industry itself. To be sure, the book is no easily digested pamphlet, but it achieves a graceful balance between rigour and accessibility. Its style, coupled with its broadly market-friendly outlook, allows the book to be a credible bridge between academic ideas and those who work in the financial industry. The ability to resonate with the views of market operators, coupled with the substantial reforms that it nonetheless advocates, makes the book both critical and yet not excessively utopian. Thirdly, the approach itself is compatible with a wider set of less minimalist and less libertarian axioms. To paraphrase the late John Rawls, the role of epistemic virtues in financial markets can be seen as a module, one we can certainly 'fit' in a revised argumentative frame where the content of business ethics is more demanding and our normative commitments less centred on choice and responsibility.

For all the praise that the book undoubtedly deserves, there are also less convincing aspects. Firstly, the book does not seem to give enough weight to the role of uncertainty. The vast majority of our choices as market participants are made under what we can call radical uncertainty. That is, a situation in which we have no clear sense of the array of possible outcomes, let alone how we can attach probabilities to such outcomes. If radical uncertainty is pervasive, then, the space for recognising epistemic virtues is much more limited. De Bruin could very well come back by saying that his account, by relaxing the justificatory requirements attached to belief formation and downplaying the importance of outcomes for the attribution of virtue, goes in the right direction. However, these would only constitute partially convincing replies; if uncertainty is truly radical, we face a more qualitative problem, namely, the fact that we may be simply unable to identify what being epistemically virtuous actually means given the circumstances. The latter problem is well illustrated by the author's work on the case studies. The feeling is that the 'benefit of hindsight' is substantive: it seems much easier to outline what would have been epistemically virtuous behaviour ex-post. Here de Bruin could reasonably come back by pointing out that, and this is apparent in the book, the information he used for his case studies and assessments was available to members of the financial industry at the time (i.e., before the crisis). However, once again, this reply can only capture part of the problem. The point is rather that the importance of, and specific relevance of, different aspects of the available information (that is, available at the time) has only become apparent after the fact.

The second problem pertains to what we can call the social determinants of epistemic virtue. This is perhaps where the book's ideological standpoint eventually comes to bear on the argument about epistemic virtue itself. If being epistemically virtuous is the ability to develop the correct dispositions towards the formation of our beliefs, one is bound to ask: what are the social and political circumstances that favour the development of those dispositions? This question becomes particularly important when one investigates the epistemic virtues of ordinary citizens. In the initial part of the book de Bruin acknowledges that corporations and governments may have significant obligations to foster the right environment for the development of epistemic virtues (44). And yet, when we get to the behaviour of consumers, the acknowledgment seems to fade into the background, and responsibility seems to fall, by default, on the individuals themselves. De Bruin considers the idea of mandatory financial advice for loan selection, but ultimately seems to reject it (101-105). He writes that "customers with internalized epistemic virtues are closer to satisfying the epistemic conditions of the argument for liberty than those without" (98). The question one can ask is: to what extent are the 'customers' themselves responsible for creating favourable circumstances to satisfy these epistemic conditions? Many would argue that part of what creates the very obstacles that affect a person's ability to form the right type of epistemic dispositions is not just a matter of choice and character, but pertain to the more objective and socially determined circumstances in which she finds herself.

The latter problem comes sharply into the picture of de Bruin's account when he discusses behavioural biases in mortgage selection. De Bruin correctly highlights that both discriminatory biases on the part of mortgage brokers and the epistemic quality of the choices of mortgage selectors can be relevant to explain differences in the quality of the mortgages selected by different groups of individuals. However, his view fails to acknowledge the possibility that being part of a group can partly determine the type of epistemic possibilities (for lack of a better expression) of the members of such group. Members of group X can consistently perform worse in terms of the epistemic quality of their choices, but that does not explain why exactly this is the case. One is bound to suspect that the explanation depends, at least in part, on social and economic class. People who have received less education and have low paying and more insecure jobs simply face a more difficult epistemic environment (again, for lack of a better way of describing the problem), and yet, it would seem implausible to maintain that they are fully responsible for the circumstances in which they have to form their beliefs.

De Bruin writes that some of the research he has surveyed seems to suggest the conclusion that "subprime borrowers . . . are less likely to love knowledge" (101) and later adds that "borrowers whose decisions end well have more knowledge of mortgage terms, they show more extensive search behaviour and see more room to choose terms" (101). Finally, he quips: "Love of knowledge, one could say, pays off" (101). This reviewer's reactions to the findings he cites were different. The impression is that it is being born in the right family that really pays off by giving one access to better education and better paying jobs and in turn to more time and peace of mind to actually develop one's epistemic virtues. Empirical research on the determinants of search behaviour is still in its infancy, so it is impossible to cite robust evidence to the effect that social and economic background is central. Furthermore, it seems plausible to believe that socio-economic background cannot explain all differences in search behaviour for mortgage selection. However, this reviewer believes that de Bruin's analysis would benefit from a more thorough engagement with the aforementioned topic and a more extensive analysis of the determinants of epistemic virtues, one that can more reliably control for agents' socio-economic standing.

What is the overall 'verdict'? While one can agree with de Bruin that outcomes may not be central to conceptualise epistemic virtues, this reviewer is happy to report that the author's work both shows the right dispositions and, disagreements notwithstanding, a good measure of success in producing good outcomes. In short, this is an excellent book -- one that deserves to be read carefully.


Howard Davies, The Financial Crisis: Who is to Blame?, Polity Press, 2010.

Joseph Heath, Morality, Competition and the Firm: The Market Failures Approach to Business Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2014.

Loren E. Lomasky, Liberty After Lehman, Social Philosophy and Policy 28 (2011): 135-65.