Ethics and Theological Disclosures: The Thought of Robert Sokolowski

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Mansini, Guy and , James G. (eds.), Ethics and Theological Disclosures: The Thought of Robert Sokolowski, The Catholic University of America Press, 2003, 198pp, $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 0813213517.

Reviewed by Joseph Koterski, Fordham University


Robert Sokolowski has long argued that philosophy makes progress through distinctions. Distinctions set things apart, and valid distinctions have their cogency by virtue of some genuine and significant difference that they highlight.

Of Sokolowski we can say that he is a philosopher of distinction in two senses – by virtue of his own careful attention to making distinctions as a route to philosophical insight and by virtue of his widely acknowledged success at that task. It is distinction in this second sense that occasions the present book – the unusual but well-deserved honor of a second Festschrift. The first came in 1996 under the title of The Truthful and the Good (Kluwer). Like the first, this second volume has its own distinctive thematic unity (a focus on Sokolowski’s ethical and theological thought) and thus is likely to prove more useful than the average Festschrift. Guy Mansini’s introduction provides a fine overview of Sokolowski’s distinctive take on phenomenology in general and his special contributions to that field.

Five of the essays, plus the honoree’s own contribution to this volume (an essay on the self-disclosure of the Holy Trinity), concern various themes in the theology of disclosure. This is a field that Sokolowski pioneered in The God of Faith and Reason (1982) and then further advanced in Eucharistic Presence (1994). It involves an effort to bring the resources of phenomenology to the service of theology by reflecting on how the light of revelation makes various truths of faith appear to those who receive them and on how it illuminates the presence and action within the world of a God who is entirely other than the world he created. For Sokolowski, the particular way in which Christians make the distinction between God and the world is significantly different from the ways in which other cultures and religions make the distinction, in that for Christians God should not be thought of as any “part” of the “whole” – not even the “best” part – but as truly transcending the universe.

Appreciating the various ways in which reality appears to those who have received and accepted revelation is one of the chief tasks of the theology of disclosure. For Sokolowski, this task is profoundly assisted by Husserlian phenomenology. Owen Sadlier’s pivotal essay identifies some of the crucial philosophical elements in this approach, especially in the areas of epistemology (the disclosiveness of distinctions) and metaphysics (the logic of parts and wholes as revelatory of the structure of being and the teleology of consciousness). He explains that at the heart of what Sokolowski has called “the Christian distinction” between God and the world is the insight that God would have been no less in goodness or greatness if the world had never come to exist. Where the finest of ancient philosophers made admirable progress by transforming the anthropomorphic deities of mythology into pure rational principles in the course of thoroughly refining the concept of God, they seem always to have envisioned God as still part of the whole – perhaps the highest part, but never absolutely transcending the universe in the way that “the Christian distinction” invariably professes.

Several of the essays comment on other features of Sokolowski’s theological works. Gerard Jacobitz analyzes his account of how metaphors operate differently when revealing things about God than about the world. James G. Hart elucidates Sokolowski’s account of the puzzles involved in understanding how prayer works in regard to a divinity conceived according to “the Christian distinction.” The God whom we address in prayer, for instance, must not be made into yet one more object within the world, despite the appearance of doing just this that the language of prayer invariably suggests. John Brough reviews the main themes of Sokolowski’s book Eucharistic Presence. After dispatching some of the prima facie objections likely to be raised against using phenomenology in theology at all, he illustrates some of the ways in which a careful distinction between representation and reenactment can provide considerable aid in appreciating the kinds of divine presence that faith finds in the Eucharist.

Sokolowski’s own masterful essay and the speculative contribution on faith and reason penned by John C. McCarthy are themselves worth the price of the book. By treating the personal pronouns with which the Scriptures record the self-disclosure of the Holy Trinity, Sokolowski argues that human speech, when spoken by the Incarnate Son and confirmed by the Holy Spirit, proves capable of revealing certain aspects of the eternal life of the Trinity. In the course of presenting his arguments for this thesis, we receive yet another helpful account from Sokolowski’s own hand of the differences among pagan, Jewish, and Christian ways of distinguishing God and the world. While the pagans, even in the demythologized accounts of their philosophers, tended to understand these gods as the best, the most powerful, and the most beautiful things in the cosmos, they never conceived of their divinities as beyond the cosmos in the way that the Jews were enabled to understand God as the creator of the cosmos and thus as different from that cosmos. Christianity brings about a further modification of the Jewish understanding, for Jesus’s way of speaking of God as his Father and as the one who sent him discloses various aspects of the love of the persons within the Trinity for one another and thus reveals significant aspects of God’s inner life.

McCarthy’s essay does not so much attempt to comment on any of Sokolowski’s texts but to use his principles in the genuine spirit of their framer. The topic for McCarthy’s reflections is the long-standing but ever-perplexing problem of the relation of faith and reason. He takes as his opening gambit a subject much remarked upon ever since Pope John Paul II’s encyclical Fides et Ratio, namely, the curious way in which the Church, so long criticized for obstructionism by the rationalists, has become the greater defender of reason as genuinely capable of knowing certain truths about God, morality, and the purpose of human life. In particular, McCarthy treats at length a controversial and often misunderstood Church document, Vatican I’s statements about the capabilities of natural reason in Dei Filius.

In order to make some progress on these questions, McCarthy makes use of some of the insights to which Sokolowski has given such prominence in his theology of disclosure, not only an appreciation for the unique nature of “the Christian distinction” between God and the world but also an attentiveness to how revelation illuminates the basic truths of faith. At considerable length he applies these points to some of the scriptural passages most crucial for the biblical understanding of the relation of faith and reason: the first chapters of Romans, where Paul makes various claims about what pagans should have been able to know about the invisible things of God on the basis of visible parts of the created world, and the sermon of Paul on the Areopagus that is recounted in the Acts of the Apostles, where Paul makes use of the statue of the unknown God in order to acquaint the Athenians with the true nature of God and his relation to the world. What makes the essay especially rewarding is McCarthy’s constant return to the philosophical questions that occur when reading such passages in light of the claims about faith and reason made by Dei Filius. On a topic that is very well-worn by now in the literature, McCarthy’s use of Sokolowski’s theology of disclosure manages to shed some new and quite helpful light.

The second group of essays in the present volume takes up a number of ethical and political questions germane to the work of the honoree. Richard Cobb-Stevens and Guy Mansini each consider the topic of friendship, while John Drummond examines the interesting question of the need and the difficulty of being disinterested if one is ever to be a good judge in one’s own case. Sokolowski’s recent essays on justice and friendship provide the grist for the mill of these commentators, and they draw out various useful comparisons involving Aristotle, Aquinas, Husserl, and such contemporary theorists as Martha Nussbaum and Michael Oakeshott.

Much as in the case of McCarthy’s essay in the theological section, Francis Slade’s essay in this section of the book is also a tour de force that expands outward from Sokolowski’s insights rather than entering into the commentatorial mode. Slade’s starting-point is the warning that Sokolowski issued against an abuse of phenomenology’s famous distinction between the “natural attitude” and the “philosophical attitude.” In his Introduction to Phenomenology he writes (pp. 62-63): “One of the dangers to philosophy is that it may think that it can replace the prephilosophical life … If philosophy tries to substitute for prephilosophical thinking, the result is rationalism, the kind of rationalism introduced into modern philosophy by Machiavelli in regard to political and moral life, and by Descartes in regard to theoretic matters.”

Alert to this warning, Slade compares the forms of political philosophy typical of modernity and those typical of pre-modern (ancient and medieval) times. The argument for the modern forms, he finds, invariably grounds the justification for government on philosophical discussion, that is, on a claim that political arrangements are merely a construct by reason and should always be tested by what philosophers deem reasonable. For modern political philosophy, rule should not be based on the authority of tradition or religion; this would be to say that a given regime is ultimately justified because it would be government of a certain kind and based on an authority prior to or higher than the use of reason to devise some sort of social contract.

Slade then undertakes a sustained analysis of Plato’s Crito, a dialogue often interpreted nowadays as if it were teaching the same lesson that modern political philosophy teaches, namely, the obligation of a citizen to obey the state. Slade shows that the philosophical argument for obedience within the Crito is designed to show why a philosopher like Socrates needs to obey, not why any particular rule should rule. But the argument for obedience by Socrates is not the same as the argument for a certain kind of rule in the city. In fact, the argument that shows that Socrates should not escape would presumably not hold in any other sort of city than the one in which the rulers of the city are the laws themselves, as they are in the Athens of the dialogue. The Crito is thus not presenting universal precepts of political obligation that will bind every citizen as such to the state, regardless of its form of government, but only a specific counter-argument to that of the character Crito, who had tried to convince Socrates that he should escape. The properly political argument in the Crito, Slade urges, is not that made by Socrates or by Crito, but by the laws themselves (at 50a6-54d1). The laws whom the character Socrates quotes – and we see here an appreciation for Sokolowski’s judicious comments on the distancing effect of any quotation – do not present an argument that everyone is obliged to obey governments as such, but rather a political argument for republican rule that bases authority and obligation on a certain type of regime as best for people of a certain moral character. This is not the modern understanding of the impartial “rule of law” but an ancient understanding of “rule by the laws” that certain morally good citizens have made.

Both sections of this book, the theological and the ethical, present some fine essays that comment on Robert Sokolowski’s thought as well as essays that attempt to apply certain of his insights and principles to new problems. The volume is much to be commended.