Ethics Done Right: Practical Reasoning as a Foundation for Moral Theory

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Elijah Millgram, Ethics Done Right: Practical Reasoning as a Foundation for Moral Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 360pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521548268

Reviewed by Alison Hills, University of Bristol


Ethics Done Right is a collection of papers on ethics and practical reasoning, consisting of an introduction plus eleven chapters, nine of which have previously been published, some of which are already well known. The essays cover a wide range within practical philosophy, including utilitarianism, Kant's ethics, Hume's theory of practical reason, virtue ethics, particularism, and incommensurability. Despite the apparent disparateness of the topics, there is a theme running through the book, which we might call "the primacy of practical reason". Millgram's thesis is that we need to figure out the correct view of practical reason before we begin the task of identifying the correct moral theory.

If asked, most moral philosophers would probably identify "reflective equilibrium", or perhaps "wide reflective equilibrium" as their favoured methodology. We take into account our moral reactions to real or imaginary circumstances, but also our background theories of non-moral matters. We formulate moral principles that agree with these as far as possible, and then alter our principles and our intuitions until the remaining disagreement dissolves. The moral principles that are the outcome of this process are thereby justified. Wide reflective equilibrium essentially requires us to find an ethical theory that is consistent and coherent with all the relevant considerations. Understood in this way, it appears uncontroversial and perhaps unavoidable. Not so, according to Millgram. If you give up a moral theory when it clashes with your intuitions, you are really objecting to a consequence that you simply do not like. Wide reflective equilibrium invites complacency, and indeed is "a method formally indistinguishable from intellectual dishonesty" (p. 10).

Millgram's favoured alternative is the "Method of Practical Reasoning" (p. 2):

Get an overview of as many different theories of practical reasoning as possible.

Puzzle out what moral theories those accounts of practical reasoning give rise to.

Without appealing to any substantive moral theory, determine which theory of practical reasoning is correct.

Adopt the moral theory paired with that theory of practical reasoning.

Millgram suggests a number of benefits of the Method. First, it allows for the possibility that we may find that an entirely new and unexpected moral theory is correct and that our moral intuitions are radically mistaken; we therefore avoid complacency and remain intellectually honest. Secondly, it secures the practical importance of morality: "If the method of practical reasoning works, it gives you a moral theory with a built-in advantage: you know why you have a reason to do what it says" (p. 3).

In Ethics Done Right, Millgram hopes to use the Method to defend five claims (pp. 4-7):

The moral theories of the past have distinctive takes on practical reasoning.

Central features of those moral theories are consequences of the theories of practical reasoning that underlie them.

Problems in moral theories can often be traced back to problems in the underlying theory of practical reasoning.

Theories of practical reasoning impose strong constraints on moral theory: the method of practical reasoning is a powerful selection tool.

If the method of practical reasoning is successful, it will have the advantage that the correct moral theory will come with an argument.

Millgram's Method of Practical Reasoning raises several initial worries. First, the Method appears simply to beg the question when it comes to the practical authority of morality. Perhaps we simply do not always have reason to do what is morally right. The Method of Practical Reasoning does not seem to allow us to take this kind of moral scepticism seriously.

Leaving scepticism aside, there are also difficulties in applying the Method. When one attempts to attack a moral theory by criticising the "underlying" theory of practical reason, it is of course crucial that one has correctly identified the relevant theory of practical reason. This is not always a straightforward task.

In addition, one might question whether it is realistic to expect to be able to assess a theory of practical reason independently of our moral intuitions. A great deal of our practical reasoning concerns reasoning in a social context, when other people are involved. There are obviously connections between what we take to be our reasons to treat these people well or badly, and what we take to be morally required or permitted of us. In response, Millgram points out that not all practical reasoning takes place when the interests of others are at stake: some is purely instrumental, some is purely prudential. We can assess theories of practical reason in those contexts or even try to evaluate them independently of any context: we may find that some theories turn out to be internally inconsistent. But it is far from obvious that we can settle the question of the correct theory of practical reasoning without taking into account reasoning in social contexts and without any reference to moral considerations.

The chapters following the introduction serve to illustrate (1)-(5) rather than to argue directly for them. Millgram hopes to identify the theories of practical reasoning underlying classical utilitarianism, Kant's moral theory, and virtue ethics, and to show that problems specifically with the theory of practical reason cause problems in the relevant moral theories. But not all of these uses of the Method are successful.

In "Mill's proof of the principle of utility", Millgram suggests that many of the problems of utilitarianism stem from its distinctive theory of practical reasoning, which he identifies as instrumentalism. For the instrumentalist, ends are not determined by reason but by brute psychological facts, so it is natural for an instrumentalist to assume that "what matters" is a combination of our desires, preferences, or other mental states, in other words, subjective happiness or utility.

Millgram attributes this reasoning to Mill, but there are obvious difficulties in taking instrumentalism to ground utilitarianism, as Millgram points out. If there is nothing to be said in favour of any ends above any others, as instrumentalism implies, then there is nothing to be said in favour of promoting the happiness of others rather than anything else, as utilitarianism requires (and nothing to be said in favour of giving extra weight to the preferences of the more experienced, as Mill suggests). It seems that instrumentalism simply cannot support utilitarianism. But this is perhaps a reason to question whether it really is the theory of practical reason underlying the ethical theory, rather than grounds to reject utilitarianism altogether.

It is more common to regard the theory of practical reason supporting utilitarianism as maximizing consequentialism: "You have reason to maximize the good". Together with a claim about value -- "The good is happiness" -- this theory of practical reason grounds classical utilitarianism.

Some of Millgram's criticisms of utilitarianism have force against this conception of it. In "What's the use of utility?" he argues that subjective happiness (i.e. desire-satisfaction or pleasure) cannot play the role that utilitarianism requires of it. As time passes, new pleasures fade and we accustom ourselves to disappointments. Millgram suggests that the role of pleasure and pain is to alert us to changes in well-being. It is a mistake to treat them primarily as a goal, as classical utilitarianism does (Millgram has a similar argument against treating desire -satisfaction as an end). This is a genuine difficulty for classical utilitarianism. But according to the conception of its structure set out above, it is a problem for its theory of value ("The good is (subjective) happiness"), not its theory of practical reason ("You have reason to maximize the good"). It is questionable, therefore, whether either of the chapters on utilitarianism actually implements the Method of Practical Reason.

Much more successful is the chapter on Kant. Millgram argues that the formula of universal law (FUL), the conception of practical reason underlying Kant's moral theory, is incoherent. Consider the "CI-maxim" ("CI" for "categorical imperative"):

When I am making up my mind what to do, I will act only on maxims that pass the CI procedure, so as to make (morally or rationally) permissible decisions.

Can I will this maxim as a universal law? Millgram argues not. For if everyone accepts the CI-maxim, they will all choose to act on a policy that they can regard as a universal law, and they will refuse to make exceptions to it. But it is a deep fact about human nature that at least sometimes we need others to make exceptions for us, so that we can successfully carry out our projects. So I cannot will the CI-maxim as a universal law: to try to do so results in a contradiction in the will.

Millgram's Method works well in this case. The FUL test is unquestionably important to Kantian ethics, and he has raised a significant problem for that conception of practical reason. There are a number of ways that Kantians could respond. First, they might argue that it is not appropriate to test the "CI-maxim" by means of the CI procedure. Millgram criticises this move as ad hoc: why should we treat the CI-maxim differently from any other maxim? But Kantians might reply that the way that Millgram sets up the problem is misleading. What he describes as "adopting the CI-maxim" is equivalent to testing all other maxims using the CI procedure, and this is in fact a condition of acting for reasons at all, a condition of rational agency itself. It is therefore a confusion to think that adopting the CI-maxim is something that we might, as agents, choose to do or not to do, and so something that we might evaluate by using the CI procedure.

Alternatively, Kantians might try to explain how to incorporate exceptions into their maxims, for example, by clarifying whether using the CI procedure requires acting on exceptionless policies, and explaining how the imperfect duty to help others fits with this putative requirement. But Millgram has set a considerable task for supporters of Kant, to show that the theory of practical reason supporting Kantian ethics is not self-refuting.

Millgram argues that central features of Aristotelian virtue ethics depend on an underlying theory of practical reason, namely Aristotle's practical syllogism ("Reasonably Virtuous"). For example, the conclusion of a practical syllogism is always defeasible, and the practically wise and hence virtuous person knows when the conclusion is defeasible and when it is not. The vicious person takes the conclusion to be defeasible in too many or too few circumstances. Therefore, virtue is a mean between two vices.

Millgram thinks that a better account of virtue ethics would retain the link between virtue and practical reason: the virtues are the traits that a person has when she is good at practical reasoning. Different accounts of practical reasoning will give us different versions of the virtues. We can figure out which traits are the virtues by determining the correct theory of practical reason. For example, instrumentalism will give us "narrow self-knowledge" (knowing what your ends are), resoluteness, and a few other traits as virtues; the virtues of Kantian practical reason will be rather different.

Millgram is aware that this is a revisionary conception of virtue. He regards this as a benefit: we avoid complacency by ignoring "local preconceptions of the morally admirable" (p. 133). But it is difficult to see this as an instance of the Method of Practical Reasoning -- indeed it is difficult to see how the method might possibly apply to Aristotelian virtue ethics. It is a feature of this theory that the virtues and practical wisdom are fundamentally interconnected: we cannot isolate our conception of practical wisdom from our conception of the virtues, and evaluate the former independently of the latter. Moreover, if we do end up with a conception of virtue that is, in our view, very far from morally admirable, it is difficult to see why we should see it as of great interest to us (even if it is connected to correct practical reasoning).

Millgram is aware that applying the Method of Practical Reasoning to evaluate moral theories will not be straightforward. But there are reasons to doubt both whether it is possible and whether it is desirable to attempt to separate the theory of practical reasoning underlying the ethical theory and to assess it independently. Millgram's own uses of the Method do not lay these doubts to rest. It is reasonable to wonder whether we should regard the Method as a genuine competitor to wide reflective equilibrium after all.

Even if we are sceptical about Millgram's Method, the individual chapters of Ethics Done Right all repay study in their own right. Unfortunately it is not possible in this review to do justice to the full range of topics that Millgram covers. In the chapters on Hume, he tries to show that Hume is not really an instrumentalist about practical reason but a nihilist; he also explains why Hume's History of England is so long. Two very interesting chapters on incommensurability argue that we should see commensurability of value as the outcome of successful practical reason -- the specification of our ends, a better understanding of what really matters to us through deliberation and experience -- rather than the input. In the final chapter, Millgram quite reasonably points out that inquiry into practical reason tends to be limited to the standard theories whereas it should range much more broadly, and suggests that we might start by finding parallels to practical reason in modes of theoretical reasoning (e.g. inductive and analogical reasoning).

There is much to admire about Millgram's book. It is entertainingly written, has an unusual take on familiar issues and is always insightful and interesting. Anyone interested in ethics or practical reason will find it very rewarding.