Ethics in the Conflicts of Modernity: An Essay on Desire, Practical Reasoning and Narrative

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Alasdair MacIntyre, Ethics in the Conflicts of Modernity: An Essay on Desire, Practical Reasoning and Narrative, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 322 pp., $49.99, ISBN 9781107176454.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


This work continues to develop the project of the author's celebrated and path breaking book, After Virtue (1981) -- a project extended in Whose Justice, Which Rationality? (1988), Three Rival Versions of Moral Enquiry (1990), and Dependent Rational Animals (1999). A second edition of After Virtue appeared (with a new postscript) in 1984, and a third edition (with a new prologue) in 2007. But this volume can be fully understood by readers who have not read MacIntyre's previous work. Many of the themes that readers of his earlier books are familiar with emerge anew, re-worked and integrated with further thoughts.

After Virtue paid special attention to the emotivist theory of the meaning of "good," as developed by C. L. Stevenson and R. M. Hare. This volume updates MacIntyre's encounter with this line of thought by focusing on a successor to emotivism -- the "expressivism" of Simon Blackburn and such allies as Alan Gibbard and Harry Frankfurt. A further development is that the work of Bernard Williams plays a central role in the overall argument. MacIntyre, like Williams, rejects what he calls "Morality" (always with an upper case "M"), and draws on Williams's critique of it. But for MacIntyre, Williams is also a foil: the principal goal of this work is to defend a Neo-Aristotelian and Thomistic approach to ethics. Although Williams's critique of Aristotle in Ethics and the Limits of Philosophy (1985) is one that MacIntyre treats with great respect, his new work aims to show how a Thomistic neo-Aristotelian can respond to Williams. (MacIntyre writes in the prologue to the third edition of After Virtue: "I became a Thomist after writing After Virtue in part because I became convinced that Aquinas was in some respects a better Aristotelian than Aristotle" (p. x.)

The methodology of contemporary moral philosophy is almost as important an issue for MacIntyre as the substantive ethical theory he defends. He thinks that much of what we produce in the academy, in the field of moral and political philosophy, is sterile and insignificant. That is because it (a) ignores work in such disciplines as sociology, anthropology, and psychology, (b) reflects a narrow experience of life and is removed from the everyday world outside the academy, (c) ignores cultures beyond those of advanced Western capitalism, and (d) is ahistorical, exhibiting little engagement with the major traditions and figures earlier than the twentieth century. Williams receives his attention in part because he takes him to be an exception to these professional deficiencies. He cites an obituary of Williams that calls him "arguably the greatest British philosopher of his era" (p. 152), and laments that "the vast majority of those now at work in academic moral philosophy continue to write as though Williams had never existed" (p. 152).

No one could accuse MacIntyre of sterile isolation from philosophical traditions, or the social sciences as they bear on philosophical issues, or the everyday lives of non-philosophers, or the political and social structures that shape our lives. His intellectual range and reading are vast. Nearly every page gives expression to his sense that our lives are poisoned by the fractured way we think, by the way our desires are shaped by capitalist acquisitiveness and ambition, by the subservience of the state to market inequities, and by the mystification produced by Morality, with its impersonal, unconditional, burdensome demands. Marx and Marxism play a central role in his critique of what he calls the "dominant modes of thought" in late modernist capitalism. One section of this discussion of the failures of "Morality" is devoted to the works of Oscar Wilde; another to several novels of D. H. Lawrence. The last of his five chapters depicts the lives of four exemplary twentieth-century figures: Vasily Grossman, the Jewish Russian novelist; Sandra Day O'Connor, the American jurist; C. L. R. James, the Afro-Trinidadian historian, journalist, cricketer, and socialist philosopher; and Denis Faul, the Irish priest, teacher, and social activist.

MacIntyre's biographical sketches of these individuals are meant to give concrete expression to his thesis that the practical reasoning of real people always has a narrative dimension -- a sense of what they have been and what they want to become or remain. Further, they are meant to illustrate in concrete terms his thesis

that agents do well only if and when they act to satisfy only those desires whose objects they have good reason to desire, that only agents who are sound and effective practical reasoners so act, that such agents must be disposed to act as the virtues require, and that such agents will be directed in their actions toward the achievement of their final end. (p. 243)

We do well only if our actions flow from desires for objects that we have good reason to desire. How, according to MacIntyre, should we determine which of our desires are directed at desirable goals? Following G. E. M. Anscombe in "Modern Moral Philosophy" (Philosophy, 1958 -- cited in After Virtue but not in the present work), he gives the concept of flourishing a central role to play in his Aristotelianism:

Just as wolves, dolphins, gorillas, foxes, and rabbits flourish or fail to flourish, so . . . it is too with human animals . . . When we compare future courses of action or states of affairs as better or worse, our standard is that of how far and in what ways each will contribute to or frustrate our human flourishing. (p. 25)

MacIntyre also speaks of human flourishing as the "development of our powers."

Another major theme is the common good, which, MacIntyre insists, is not to be confused with the idea, often encountered in economics, of public goods. Public goods (common examples are roads, banks, schools), as MacIntyre thinks of them, are "to be enjoyed by individuals qua individuals, while common goods are only to be enjoyed and achieved . . . by individuals qua members of various groups or qua participation in various activities" (pp. 168-9). He illustrates his conception of common goods by discussing the form they take when sought cooperatively in families, schools, and workplaces. These are social organizations that flourish by fostering the development of the powers of children, students, and workers. Teachers, for example, "achieve their good qua teachers and contribute to [the] common good by making the good of their students their overriding good" (pp. 172-3). The good of students, he adds, does not consist only or mainly in the mastery of economically valuable skills, or in becoming "autonomous preference maximizers" (p. 173), but in having "a sense of the ends that should be theirs as contrasted with the ends that others for their own purposes impose on them" (p. 173). Similarly, MacIntyre proposes that workplaces ought to be organized around the goal of excellent products and services, achieved through shared deliberation among workers. Market forces and governments subservient to capital are, he points out, powerful impediments to the existence of schools and workplaces in which individuals flourish.

I do not take MacIntyre's notion of the common good to commit him to the idea that communal flourishing is an additional goal beyond the flourishing of the individuals who belong to a community. Families, for example, should seek the flourishing of each of their members; what it is for a family fully to flourish is simply for each of its members to achieve the goods that are specific to family life. What I take him to be saying is that there are shared activities in families, schools, and workplace -- activities that no one can engage in as a solitary individual, and that these joint activities must go well for individuals to flourish.

I noted earlier that expressivism plays an important role in MacIntyre's defense of neo-Aristotelianism, just as emotivism had done in After Virtue. He is fully aware that questions about what a good life is -- even whether there is such a thing -- are not settled matters among philosophers or ordinary people, and he takes expressivism to draw much of its strength from this seemingly interminable disagreement. The superficial appeal of expressivism, as he sees it, lies in its thesis that there is no fact of the matter to be settled. As Hume, a source of inspiration for expressivism, insists, passion underlies our moral disagreements; we cannot reason our way to the vindication of one conception of the good as opposed to another:

There is no fact of the matter about human flourishing, independent of the various accounts of human flourishing that are in contention. . . Whatever particular view of human flourishing is presupposed by or expressed in the actions of this individual or that set of individuals . . . is, so the expressivist will insist, the expression of a prerational endorsement of the valuations and normative judgments that constitute a particular view of human flourishing . . . (p. 39)

Yet MacIntyre regards expressivism not just as one more failed metaethics, but as a stepping stone to philosophical enlightenment. It is, he thinks, a salutary reaction to the dominance of Morality in our culture. Morality tells us to honor our obligations because they are the dictates of reason -- but does not reason also tell us to maximize good consequences? The conflict between utilitarian and Kantian conceptions of Morality is not going to be resolved through further philosophical subtleties and complexities, and so it is natural to infer that moral reasoning is merely an expression of pre-rational attitudes, lacking any basis in facts out there in the world. We need not be puzzled about why philosophical disputes between the competing normative theories of modernity never end: for the expressivist, there are no moral properties that these competing theorists can get right. If one's only options were to buy into Morality or be an expressivist, we should choose the latter.

But, of course, MacIntyre's ultimate goal is to convince the reader that there really is such a thing as human flourishing, just as there is such a thing as the flourishing of an owl or a lion -- and that it lies in the development of our powers, as Aristotle held. Having worked our way out of Morality with the help of expressivism, we will be ready to give full weight to the obvious fact that, just as other animals flourish in some conditions and not others, so too we. MacIntyre's appropriation of the work of Bernard Williams has the same structure: he too can help us demystify Morality, and once the weaknesses in his critique of Aristotelianism are recognized, the way is open to our becoming neo-Aristotelians.

Goodness plays a central role in MacIntyre's ethics -- just as it does for Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, the utilitarians, and G. E. Moore. He writes: "To act for a good reason is to act for the sake of achieving some good or preventing or avoiding some evil" (p. 8). "To justify an action just is to show that the good to be achieved by so acting outweighs the good to be achieved by any alternative course of action open to the agent" (p. 9). But suppose someone, having recently read W. D. Ross's The Right and the Good, challenges these statements in the following way: "Yes, one kind of good reason is the achievement of good or the prevention of evil. But why do you say that this is the only kind of good reason? If an act is morally right, is that not also a reason in its favor; and if it is morally wrong, is that not also a reason against it?" MacIntyre might respond by saying: "You have misunderstood me. I am using the word 'good' so broadly that any act for which there is a reason counts as an act that achieves some good." But I very much doubt that this is what he has in mind. Rather, I take him to mean that being morally right is not one way for an act to be good. Some things, he seems to assume, have the property of being good, and ultimately all practical justification must show how an action has that property or leads to something else that has it.

For Moore, the concept of goodness, which he takes to be central to moral philosophy, is not to be confused with the defective concept of being good for someone. By contrast, for other sorts of utilitarians (sometimes called "welfarists"), the good to be maximized is well-being -- which consists in whatever is non-derivatively good for an individual. MacIntyre of course is no utilitarian (it is the common good, not the maximum good, that we should seek). But I do not find in this book a commitment to either a welfarist or a Moorean conception of goodness.

That makes me uncertain how to understand some of his claims. Return, for example, to his statement that teachers "achieve their good qua teachers and contribute to [the] common good by making the good of their students their overriding good" (pp. 172-3). We might take this to mean: (A) When teachers give their students the benefits of a good education, those teachers achieve their good in that they have done a good thing; they have done well by their students. But we might read MacIntyre's statement to be saying something stronger: (B) when teachers give their students the benefits of a good education, that not only makes their students better off, but it makes them better off as well -- the quality of their lives is better. If MacIntyre holds (A) but not (B), it is not clear how much he differs from someone who says: "When teachers give their students the benefits of a good education, those teachers have done the right thing, whether or not they themselves benefit." On the other hand, if he does hold (B), we are left wondering: precisely how is being a good teacher good for teachers themselves? A larger question looms: how is being a good human being good for a human being?

As the word "conflict" used in his title suggests, the existence of rival schools of moral thought -- their inability to agree upon the one right theory -- is a recurring theme of MacIntyre's work:

Each party finds its own objections to the other rival standpoints compelling, and no party finds the arguments advanced against it persuasive . . . New arguments have been advanced, new distinctions drawn, new insights developed, but this in general without bringing any of the contending parties any nearer to agreement on the major issues, whether substantive or metaethical. (p. 66)

I take MacIntyre to be implying that deep disagreement is a lamentable feature of the current and past philosophical landscape. It is, in other words, a collective failing of those engaged in philosophical disputation that although each party, again and again, proposes new arguments meant to persuade others, those others are seldom if ever convinced. The debates seem interminable and perhaps therefore futile.

But this book will not bring those conflicts to an end, as its author must realize. And, in any case, would not philosophy lose a considerable part of its value if every philosopher became a neo-Aristotelian, or a Kantian, or a utilitarian -- and similarly if the main divisions of opinion in other branches of philosophy also disappeared? Philosophical uniformity about the most fundamental issues would still leave room for disputes about subsidiary matters and details, but even so the subject would be more cut-and-dried, less distinctive as a mode of thought, less challenging, and less fascinating. It is certainly not the ultimate goal of the philosophical enterprise to pave the way for the day when all philosophers basically think alike.

It should nonetheless be clear from these remarks that Ethics in the Conflicts of Modernity is an essential addition to MacIntyre's distinguished body of work.