Eudaimonic Ethics: The Philosophy and Psychology of Living Well

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Lorraine Besser-Jones, Eudaimonic Ethics: The Philosophy and Psychology of Living Well, Routledge, 2014, 183pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415728164.

Reviewed by Sven Nyholm, University of Cologne


With just 168 pages of running text, this is a fairly slim volume. Even so, Lorraine Besser-Jones presents remarkably rich interlocking accounts of human well-being, character, and virtue. These are, in turn, built from more basic parts, which systematically fit together like the pieces of a puzzle, and draw on themes from ancient Greek philosophy as well as contemporary empirical psychology. I will first describe the various elements of Besser-Jones's theory, doing my best to roughly sketch the overall picture she carefully paints, and then offer a few criticisms.

The foundation of Besser-Jones's theory is an account of human nature she imports from "self-determination theory," as developed by psychologists like Richard Ryan and Edward L. Deci. At the heart of this theory sits the hypothesis that there are three innate psychological needs possessed by all human beings. These are needs for "relatedness," "autonomy," and "competence." We cannot be satisfied with our lives and function properly psychologically, according to self-determination theory, unless we (i) experience ourselves as having good relations to those around us; (ii) identify with and endorse our goals; and (iii) are able to competently pursue those goals. This understanding of human nature grounds Besser-Jones's theory of well-being.

More specifically, this is a theory of psychological well-being. According to Besser-Jones, we enjoy psychological well-being to the extent that we engage in behaviors that help to satisfy our three innate psychological needs. Or, as she sometimes puts it, "what counts is the having of experiences that satisfy [our] need[s]" for relatedness, autonomy, and competence. (18, emphasis in original)

It is plausible to think of well-being in this way, Besser-Jones argues, because satisfying these needs correlates with high cognitive functioning and contentment, whereas failing to satisfy them correlates with poor cognitive functioning and mental suffering. We gain this knowledge from a deep well of empirical research springing from the labs of self-determination theorists such as Ryan and Deci. Satisfying these innate psychological needs is, Besser-Jones concludes, "clearly a valuable state." (23) It amounts to a certain form of mental health. And health is clearly a positive and desirable thing. Despite initially declaring that she will build her theory on an empirical psychological understanding of human nature, Besser-Jones cannot avoid appealing to certain non-empirical value judgments, judgments about what modes of functioning are good for people.

Regarding how to satisfy our need for relatedness, Besser-Jones argues that we must develop a concern to give those around us care and respect. Or rather, we need to relate to others in mutually caring and mutually respectful ways. Our need for relatedness cannot be satisfied in conditions under which we are either only givers or receivers of care and respect. This need for relatedness, furthermore, enjoys a certain priority in relation to the two other innate psychological needs Besser-Jones posits. Much of the discussion, therefore, concerns what sorts of character and virtuous dispositions we need to develop in order to be able to "act well," and thereby satisfy our pressing psychological need for relatedness.

According to Besser-Jones's account of character, we should not think of a person's character as simply consisting in a set of behavioral dispositions. When writers like John Doris and Gilbert Harman offer empirically based skeptical arguments against character traits, they typically treat a person's character as sets of dispositions to enact certain patterns of behavior (going through the motions of routinely keeping promises, helping others, telling the truth, etc.). Besser-Jones responds that a person's character is better regarded as a matter of how her moral beliefs interact with her intentions, and the ways in which these interactions function to regulate her actions. Following Hume, Besser-Jones treats what goes on within the person's mind as primary when it comes to what sort of character she has.

Consider next Besser-Jones's theory of virtue. According to it, virtue consists in states of character that reliably lead a person to "act well": i.e., in ways that fulfill the person's three innate psychological needs, in particular her need for relatedness. Hence on this account, virtue consists in any interaction-patterns between a person's moral beliefs and her intentions that reliably make her perform actions that promote her psychological well-being. Virtue, then, is a wholly instrumental good. It is not good in itself, but only as a means for the promotion of "eudaimonic well-being." And it is strictly a prudential good: at bottom, it is good because it helps us to fulfill our own psychological needs.

Is it realistic to urge people to become more virtuous? The so-called "situationist challenge" to virtue ethics notwithstanding, Besser-Jones thinks that there is an empirical case for thinking that the sort of virtue she is interested in falls within the range of what can reasonably be expected of people. This empirical case rests on findings within "self-regulation theory," the second major branch of empirical psychology Besser-Jones drawn on.

What self-regulation theorists say Besser-Jones finds particularly relevant to her project is that we can make ourselves more efficient in our pursuit of general goals by forming more concrete "implementation intentions." A dieter, for example, is more likely to enjoy success in her dieting if she forms very concrete intentions about what she can and cannot eat, and about what at what times she can and cannot eat, rather than if she merely forms a general plan to eat less and less often. In a similar manner, Besser-Jones suggests, a virtuous person can improve her character by forming concrete implementation-intentions about how to become more caring and respectful towards others. This has a further implication, Besser-Jones adds. It shows that contrary to what skeptics about the role of reason in the life of the ethical agent maintain, practical reason can play a very important role in moral life. Forming implementation intentions, or more concrete plans for how to autonomously and competently achieve relatedness, requires reflection and the adoption of certain rules. It requires the exercise of practical reason.

In sum: Besser-Jones holds that well-being consists in having the experience of satisfying three innate psychological needs at the core of human nature: "relatedness," "autonomy," and "competence." Of these three, the first is the most central one, and we satisfy it by interacting with our fellows in caring and respectful ways: by "acting well." To act well, we need a virtuous character: we need certain moral beliefs, and we need those to interact with our intentions in ways that reliably lead us to act in ways that help to satisfy our psychological needs.

It is striking that Besser-Jones's theory is based exclusively on an account of psychological well-being. It is equally striking that the only type of basic argument she wishes to advance on behalf of character-building and virtue is of a purely prudential kind. That is, Besser-Jones argues that the overarching reason we have to develop a good character or virtue is that this promotes our own psychological well-being. These are, it seems to me, important respects in which her theory is too narrow.

What, first, about the body and its proper functioning? Besser-Jones writes that it appears pretty obvious that a well-functioning and healthy body is a positive thing. She makes this point in connection with her argument that "eudaimonic well-being" is good since it involves having a well-functioning and healthy mind. If, as Besser-Jones points out, it is clearly a good thing to have a healthy body, why does physical health not matter to her overall account of well-being in the way that psychological health does? We have bodies in addition to having minds. A comprehensive account of human well-being will treat the proper functioning and health of both of these as important components of well-being. And once we include bodily well-being in our overall account of human well-being, it seems that we would also need to allow that there are positive states of character that have to do with how good we are at taking care of our bodies. If we think, as Besser-Jones does, that it is virtuous to conduct ourselves in ways that promote our minds and psychological health, it appears unmotivated to not also say that we're virtuous if we take good care of our bodies and physical health.

The next question is whether it isn't also too narrow to only allow arguments based on prudential value to ground our accounts of what virtue amounts to. We normally don't only care about developing virtue, or building good character, within ourselves. We also greatly value virtue in others. As Philip Pettit expresses this idea, it is a common sentiment that "beyond the satisfaction of basic needs, there is nothing more important to having a good life than enjoying the attachment, the virtue and the respect of our fellows" (2015). Or, as Cicero puts it, it is generally agreed that "it ought to be our purpose to leave none unbefriended in whom there is any trace of virtue" (1991).

In other words, we view it as a great good in its own right if those around us possess qualities of mind and character that can or do make them into good friends or associates of ours. Why not allow the fact that somebody possesses a quality that helps to build good relationships to itself count as a sufficient argument to the effect that the given quality is a virtue? Why require, as Besser-Jones does, that our most basic arguments all ultimately focus on what promotes the psychological functioning of the agent herself? Given the value we place on virtue in others, and the value we place on good relationships, it appears overly narrow to require that our philosophical accounts always trace virtue back to what promotes the agent's own psychological well-being. And it's hard to swallow the thesis that virtue couldn't be something admirable and honorable in its own right, but only good as a means.

Moreover -- to use a phrase that is perhaps starting to get a little worn-out in contemporary ethics -- arguing that we ought in the end to give others our care and respect because this promotes our own psychological well-being appears to give the "wrong kind of reason" for bestowing this care and respect upon our fellows. It is surely a nice bonus that doing so improves our psychological functioning. But this added bonus appears secondary to the independent moral value of people's giving each other due care and respect.

A third way in which Besser-Jones's theory can appear too narrow concerns the number of needs it posits. Why only three? In an endnote to chapter two, Besser-Jones mentions a longer list suggested by self-determination theorist Carol Ryff. This list, unlike the shorter one Besser-Jones uses, also includes items such as needs for a "meaningful purpose in life" and "personal growth." Ryff is surely right that a human life goes better, and feels more fulfilling, if it involves the presence of a meaningful purpose and personal growth. As positive psychologist Martin Seligman puts it, we get a tremendous sense of meaning if we feel that we are part of "something bigger than ourselves" (2011). This is something most people seek. And it is surely also right that personal growth is a widely sought-after good, which makes a human life richer and more fulfilling.

Besser-Jones might wish to reply that personal growth can be subsumed under the general category of competence, and that meaning in life -- "serving something greater than ourselves" -- can be subsumed under the category of relatedness. This, however, would suggest that she understands these needs in overly broad ways. Hence Besser-Jones seems to face a dilemma. Either she excludes goods such as meaning and personal growth, in which case her theory of the human good appears to leave out important goods, or she subsumes those left-out goods under the three main goods she has as parts of her theory, in which case those goods become unhelpfully broad.

The general category of a need for relatedness is, as it stands, already a very broad category. It seems like a good idea to sub-divide this general need into various more particular needs. What we seek in romantic relationships, for example, is very different from what we value in our relationships with children. Needs related to personal relationships -- such as our relationships with our families and friends -- are different than those we have with respect to our relationships with the members of our local communities. It might be true, on a very general level, that all of these kinds of relationships are improved if they involve certain forms of care and respect. But the forms of care and respect we should give to, say, our children are surely different from those we should give to our neighbors.

The thesis that we have a need for relatedness best satisfied through social interaction marked by care and respect certainly seems like a good starting point for a discussion of which virtues improve social interactions. But to get beyond this wide starting point to something more concrete and substantive, it seems that we need to consider the different types of relatedness we seek and value, and then ask, in each case, how best to build and nurture good relationships of those different kinds. The idea of a general need for relatedness appears a little too broad to do any more concrete work.

Return lastly to Besser-Jones's claim that "what counts is the having of experiences that satisfy [our] need[s]" for relatedness, autonomy, and competence. Many readers familiar with recent philosophical debates about well-being are likely to ask the following question. Should we take the claim that experiences are what count to mean that if it were possible to simulate these experiences using wonder-drugs or a Nozickian "experience machine," those simulated experiences would be just as valuable and just as contributory to our flourishing as authentic relatedness, autonomy, and competence are? Besser-Jones does not, as far as I could tell, speak to this point, but her theory is billed specifically as a theory of psychological well-being. As a result, we are left unsure whether the theory ultimately only assigns value to inner subjective experiences, or whether it is an objectively demanding theory that understands human flourishing as necessarily involving actual relatedness, autonomy, and competence. This is something it would be interesting to hear more about in future development of the theory.

But to conclude: even though I have raised a number of concerns about her theory, I am certainly among those who look forward to seeing how Besser-Jones will develop her "eudaimonic ethics" in future writings. Hers is an exciting research program, and this book is an impressive launching pad for it. Anybody interested in virtue ethics and/or moral psychology will find this book rewarding and well worth engaging with.


Cicero, Marcus Tullio 1991. On Duties. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press

Pettit, Philip 2015. The Robust Demands of the Good. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Seligman, Martin 2011. Flourish. New York: Free Press.