Everything in Its Right Place: Spinoza and Life by the Light of Nature

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Joseph Almog, Everything in Its Right Place: Spinoza and Life by the Light of Nature, Oxford University Press, 2014, 143pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199314393.

Reviewed by Yitzhak Y. Melamed, Johns Hopkins University


I do not know whether I am getting Spinoza's metaphysics right in the present essay. I suppose this will take another decade . . . . Spinoza is the first philosopher (after thirty years of professional philosophy!) with whom I feel no unbridgeable gulf between teaching philosophy from 10 am to noon and going for a run in the hills from noon to 1, no apartheid between thinking and being. (p. xi)

There is something charming in this admission of modesty with which Joseph Almog concludes the preface to his new book. This pronouncement, as well as the Spinoza-admiring title of the book, may surprise some readers who are more acquainted with his work as philosopher of logic and language. Those readers are likely to be even further surprised by the degree to which Almog draws upon so-called "continental" work on Spinoza; indeed one can easily trace the influence of figures such as √Čtienne Balibar and Antonio Negri on Almog's reading. But Almog is an acolyte of no one (except Nature, and to a lesser extent, Spinoza). The book is marked by the freshness of an independently thinking mind, a mind which appears at some moments to be celebrating a quasi-religious "new-birth."

This book is rich in genuine insights, though it does not engage in patient, close analysis of arguments and texts. Toward the end Almog unfolds his discontent with the "dissective philosopher" who "run[s] his deductions, and feel[s] the gratification of being the master of a domain of propositions" (107). For Almog, Part I of Spinoza's Ethics is a paradigm of such "dissective philosophy," and the philosophical key is letting go of such an analytic attitude and "letting instead the key come to you by way of understanding informally 'love of God (Nature)'" (107). I do not share these views, and I will shortly explain why. More importantly, I believe this "New Age" attitude really harms the work, which could have been even more impressive than it is. But before I turn to evaluate Almog's work, let me provide a brief summary.

This concise book/essay comprises an introduction (Chapter One) -- in which the author explains his reasons for engaging with Spinoza's philosophy -- and four chapters. The second chapter presents an outline of Spinoza's metaphysics, though one in which Spinoza's key terms of 'substance,' 'attribute,' 'mode,' 'eternity,' 'idea,' and 'essence' are eliminated. Almog has no sympathy for what he describes as the "scholastic" terminology of Parts I and II of the Ethics. Instead, he turns to Spinoza's 32nd Letter (dated November 20, 1665) to provide the metaphysical foundation for his reading.[1] Almog replaces the aforementioned terms with a variety of nature-hyphenated words: 'Nature-God', 'life-in-nature', 'Nature-in-action', 'Nature-development', 'Natur-ings', 'Nature-process', 'Nature-from', and so on. For Almog, in Parts I-II of the Ethics Spinoza "indulges in a language of the philosophical priests," whereas in Letter 32, in his political writings, and in Part V of the Ethics "he tried to say it outright, with no medieval decorations" (25). Leaving aside the issue of the medieval background of Spinoza's Theological Political Treatise, his Political Treatise, and Part V of the Ethics (all of which engage to some degree with Spinoza's medieval predecessors and no less so than Ethics I-II), I somewhat doubt whether Almog's alternative terminology is much less of a "language of philosophical priests." Still, I found his exercise in attempting to replace Ethics I-II by Letter 32 both fresh and stimulating. Letter 32 is an important piece in the development of the ideas of the Ethics -- the 'mode' terminology barely appears, for example. Instead, Spinoza speaks here of a "part that has a more intimate union with its whole" (G IV/153). We tend to think about the final version of the Ethics as a statement of the "mature" Spinoza, but such a teleological attitude requires justification, and it seems to me perfectly legitimate to consider the possibility that some of the positions of the early, or middle, Spinoza are preferable to those found in the final version of the Ethics.

The most significant part of Almog's third chapter is his concise interpretation of Spinoza's views on mathematics and the nature of mathematical entities. Regrettably, Spinoza's "Letter on the Infinite" -- a key text for understanding his view of mathematics -- is barely addressed (presumably because of this letter's heavy engagement with the banned notions of eternity, substance, and mode). Still, even under these maiming restrictions, Almog succeeds in articulating a stimulating reading of Spinoza's anti-Platonist conception of mathematics as wired into nature: "Mathematics is not an add-on to being; it is the fabric of being" (50). According to Almog, Spinoza considers mathematical knowledge as de re cognition of space and objects located in space (56). Almog is clearly right in contrasting Spinoza's views with mathematical Platonism. Yet, as a result of his disregard of the "Letter of the Infinite," he fails to take into account Spinoza's nominalist conception of mathematical entities qua entia rationis.[2]

The fourth chapter addresses Spinoza's view of man and politics. Pointing out insightfully that it could not be a cosmic accident that we share political structures with humans only, Almog argues that the common liberal theories of the state as a contract among free-floating individuals fails to explain the necessity of this cosmic accident that makes us form states and share them only with members of our species. As an alternative to these liberal-individualist theories, Almog develops (for Spinoza?) a strong ontology of species,[3] according to which individuals are branches of their species, just as they are branches of Nature (74-76). The upshot of this reading is that we are wired into being with other humans, just as my hand is wired with the rest of my body: "without other humans, I have no existence and acting power. . . . there is no other way for me but the human-species way" (123). While such a theory could, in principle, help fill crucial gaps in Spinoza's argument in favor of social collaboration,[4] Almog does not adequately motivate his claims either as a reading of Spinoza or as an original political theory.

The fifth and final chapter addresses Spinoza's notion of 'amor Dei intellectualis.' This is the crux of the book, as Almog confesses: "[Spinoza's] idea of 'Love of God/Nature' is in my eyes the rarest and most precious pearl of the Ethics" (106). The chapter contains some valuable critiques of theories of human rationality[5] as well as the Cartesian and Kantian cults of the "Self" (112-115).

There are plenty of insightful moments. Almog's explication of Spinoza's view of men as completely imbedded in nature -- just as the wave is "part of" the sea[6] -- as well as his attempt to spell out an ethical foundation free from the metaphysical fairy-tales of humanism (such as Kant's "homo noumenon") are, to my mind, the most valuable and deep contributions of the book. But since it is clear that Almog does not even attempt to engage considerable parts of Spinoza's metaphysics, I think it would be proper to see the book as a certain kind of contemporary Spinozism. Still, I have to admit that I am far more impressed by Spinoza's Spinozism. Why? Because it is far bolder. Almog domesticates many of Spinoza's most daring and innovative theses, such as the absolute infinity of God/Nature and the nature of eternity and time. Almog is averse to the existence of Platonic atemporal realms (132, n. 9), but a close reading of Spinoza's discussion of eternity would show that it has very little to do with such Platonism. Similarly, Almog's view of Spinoza's Nature as limited to the kind of entities that are accessible to the human mind -- bodies and minds (or modes of the attributes of extension and thought, in Spinoza's terminology) -- asserts precisely the kind of anthropocentrism that Almog (rightly) takes Spinoza to challenge. "Nature is as rich as anything could ever be," Almog aptly writes (7). But why should we limit the richness of nature to the capacities of our mental glasses (especially if we have strong reasons/arguments to ascribe an absolute infinity of attributes to God/Nature)?

Whether it will take another decade or not, I do hope Almog continues writing on Spinoza. In the current book he presents many interesting and surprising claims. Some are difficult to evaluate in the absence of precise reference to Spinoza's text; others are genuine gems.

Let me conclude by pointing out another impressive aspect of the book: its literary style, which at times feels like genuine poetry. Here is Almog's apology on behalf of Adam, the first man and first sinner:[7]

If man is what he was made to be -- among the orchards and the apples, and the snakes, and so on -- an apple taster he was bound to be. This is how, by apple-tasting, man, in time, acted his nature -- charted and crossed deserts and oceans, bit into some deep theorems and understood his own body, as he understood the smallest quarks and largest galaxies, all just more apple tasting. (69)

[1] Addressing Cantor's engagement with Spinoza, Almog notes that "Cantor understood letter 32 to its roots" (26). This may well be the case, though, regrettably, Almog does not back his claim with any reference to Cantor's writings. Cantor's intriguing notes on Ep. 12 ("the Letter on the Infinite") in his 1883 Grundlagen are not discussed at all. For these notes, see Ewald, W. (ed.), From Kant to Hilbert, vol. II (Oxford; Clarendon Press, 1996), 890.

[2] See Spinoza, Ep. 12 (G IV/57).

[3] See, for example, Almog's claims that the species is logically prior to the individual (18), that it is the cause that generates particulars (42), and that the species has it own life (66).

[4] A specific passage I have in mind here is E4p31: "Insofar as a thing agrees with our nature, it is necessarily good."

[5] See, for example, 116: "Aside from a stipulated and genuinely 'technical' sense defined in 'idealizations' needed in game theory and mathematical economics, I have not had, in thirty-five years of philosophy, one philosopher explain to me clearly (i) what he means by 'rational,' (ii) how he 'knows' all humans are rational, or (iii) how he 'knows' many alternative life forms are not rational."

[6] For two excellent, recent studies of Spinoza's critique of the metaphysical isolation of man in nature, see John Carriero, "Spinoza, The Will, and the Ontology of Power" in The Young Spinoza: A Metaphysician in the Making, ed. Yitzhak Y. Melamed (Oxford: Oxford University, in press), and Oded Schechter, Existence and Temporality in Spinoza (University of Chicago. Ph.D. Dissertation. 2014), Ch. 3.

[7] Echoing, from afar, the chorus in Sophocles' Antigone, lines 375-415.