Evidence and Faith: Philosophy and Religion since the Seventeenth Century

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Charles Taliaferro, Evidence and Faith: Philosophy and Religion since the Seventeenth Century, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 470 pp, $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521793750.

Reviewed by Thomas M. Lennon, University of Western Ontario


Professor Taliaferro remarks in passing that the term 'evidence' derives from the Latin videre, to see. So, the title of his work might lead us to expect it to be about seeing and believing. John's gospel has something to say on this topic (20: 19-29). It tells us that, after the Resurrection, Christ appeared to his disciples, who in their fear were locked away in a room. Incidentally, even apart from this miraculous appearance, this was an episode of great significance, the occasion of the evangelistic imperative, the Pentecost, and the bestowal of the power of forgiveness. Absent from the room, however, was the disciple Thomas, who, upon report of what had occurred, replied, "unless I put my finger into [the wounds of the crucified Christ], I will not believe." But Thomas was present at the next appearance of Christ, who had him do just what he required for belief, which, when expressed, led Christ to say, "have you come to believe because you have seen me? Blessed are those who have not seen and have believed." The distinction between seeing and believing, between evidence and faith, is canonized by Paul, who contrasts the wisdom of the world from the foolishness of the cross (I Corinthians 1: 18-25). The crucifixion of Christ is a stumbling block for those who "demand signs," but "the foolishness of God is wiser than human wisdom."

Occasionally the book recognizes this contrast, as in its brief treatments of Leibniz, or of Kierkegaard, or of Malcolm's report of Wittgenstein's comment: "when I once quoted to him a remark of Kierkegaard's [about attempts to give religion a rational foundation]: 'How can it be that Christ does not exist, since I know that he has saved me?' Wittgenstein exclaimed: 'You see! It isn't a question of proving anything'!" (p.363). This is not to say that in religion there is no evidence for belief. But the evidence, it seems to me, is of a very special sort: revelation that is either direct or indirect through scripture and tradition, none of which gets much treatment here.

But overall, our expectations from the title would be disappointed, for the book is but rarely about such things. (The title was suggested, unhelpfully, by the series editor). Instead, the topic is less religion than natural theology, i.e. what can be known about God and things relating to Him solely on the basis of reason -- proofs, for example of the very sort dismissed above. An indication of the focus is the treatment of Descartes, who initially is reported to have "held that for anyone who is not already religious through faith, religious faith needs justification through natural reason -- that is, reason that is unaided by revelation" (p. 64). Now, although Descartes has some interesting things to say about those already religious through faith (he was one of them after all), the rest of the rest of the chapter shifts to the familiar project of Descartes's rationalist metaphysics (about which Taliaferro nevertheless has some insights -- on dualism for example). Another indication is the treatment of Pascal, who rejected the God of the philosophers (read: Descartes) as useless or worse. While he "made contributions to what may be called a philosophy of grace …, he is often singled out for Pascal's Wager" (italics in original, p.103). Something on a philosophy of grace would have been more welcome than the wager, which is of interest less to religion than to decision theory, but which occupies the largest part of the Pascal material here.

So what we have here is not about faith, even in the widest sense of the term, but putative knowledge of a special sort. To put it another way, the book is not about theism but deism, and respectable religion as many in the Enlightenment conceived it. Thus there is an emphasis on the civic virtue of toleration (Locke et al.) rather than the moral virtue of loving one's enemies (Matthew et al.). An author who might have bridged the gap was Bayle, who is barely mentioned here -- surprisingly, since he was a principal source, even if unwittingly so, of deism -- "the arsenal of the Enlightenment," as he came to be known.

The overall approach is historical in the sense that it treats historical figures, from Descartes, who merits a chapter, to the present, although the first chapter is devoted to the Cambridge Platonists. Hume and Kant also each get a chapter, and other chapters are devoted to the rest of early modern philosophy, nineteenth century idealism and naturalism, continental and feminist theories, positivism and the reaction to it, and finally the most recent work that is establishing a renewed respectability for the area.

The work is not really a history, however, for there is no narrative. Rather, it is a chronicle of facts, without an overall thesis. At one point Taliaferro draws attention to the recent proliferation of philosophy encyclopedias, dictionaries, companions and reference works generally (p.392). (The issue is the 1967 Encyclopedia, with its anti-religious bias). The work itself fits into this category, rather as a textbook or a reference work, "not chiefly addressed to those already in the field but to those with a background in philosophy who are interested in this vital area of inquiry" (p.7). The intended audience must be very wide; consider: "according to foundationalism all our genuine claims to knowledge are built on a foundation that is infallible (not subject to error)" (pp.58-59).

The intended broad audience combines with the scope of coverage to give the book a breathtaking encyclopedic quality. Everyone connected to the topic is at least mentioned. Perhaps the greatest value of the book will be for those looking for a quick introduction to the views on natural religion of a given author and some relevant bibliography, especially the secondary, which Taliaferro provides with impressive abundance in footnotes, usually with discussion. Occasionally, however, in his determination to be sure that everyone of relevance is mentioned even in these footnotes, Taliaferro is content to refer his reader for philosophical work on the Incarnation, for example, to the "work" of [seven authors, "among others"] without a single title (n.139, p.389). Nor is this the only example. In a discussion of knowledge as a kind of touching we are referred simply to "the work of" Franz Brentano and three other, hardly household names (n.44, p. 74). In fact, there is at one point an unintended parody of this mention of names. The chapter on continental philosophy is said to be "more defined by listing personal names rather than stating themes or problems" (n.84, p.318). (To be fair, Taliaferro's point is actually that continental philosophy is tied to individual philosophers to a greater extent than analytic philosophy.) Sometimes the text itself contains these exceedingly bare allusions. For example, we are told at the end of a brief discussion of "pluralist philosophy of religion," that "Wilfrid Cantwell Smith did a great deal to improve the representation of non-Western religions and reflection" (p.38. That and no more than a footnote reference, without comment, to one work of his.).

One result of the discursive footnotes, the structure of the book, and the kind of coverage it provides, is that a continuous reading is very difficult. I doubt that many will want to read the book from cover to cover. But if my assessment is correct, that its principal value will be as a reference work, or even a textbook, then this observation is not necessarily a criticism.

Finally, the book is also a plea on behalf of the respectability of the topic, "one of the most fascinating and profound areas of philosophy … ". Indeed, according to Taliaferro, "few areas of philosophy … lack religious implications. Any philosophical account of knowledge, values, reason, human nature, language, science, and the like will have a bearing on how one views God and the sacred [and other issues in the philosophy of religion]" (p.1). At the very end, he in so many words commends this field to us as "a place for constructive and critical, engaging philosophical work" (p.429).