Evidence and Method: Scientific Strategies of Isaac Newton and James Clerk Maxwell

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Peter Achinstein, Evidence and Method: Scientific Strategies of Isaac Newton and James Clerk Maxwell, Oxford University Press, 2013, 177pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199921850.

Reviewed by P.D. Magnus, University at Albany SUNY


In this book, Peter Achinstein mines the scientific work of Newton and Maxwell for methodological rules that can guide science when looking to formulate general laws or develop theory. These are situated in the context of Achinstein's preferred account of evidence. Along the way, he offers an extended critique of Inference to the Best Explanation.

The book is adapted from lectures, which Achinstein gave in 2011, and the style reflects that. It is clear and, in places, almost conversational. It would be accessible to general readers or undergraduates. Scholars with an interest in Achinstein's work will find it valuable but perhaps frustratingly brief.

Achinstein portrays his account of evidence as a response to what he calls the Dean's Challenge.[1] The challenge is to say whether and how philosophy of science offers anything that is relevant to scientists. In his earlier book, Achinstein answers by articulating a definition of scientific evidence. I will return to the details of his definition in a moment, but note that there is a difference between having a definition of something and being able to recognize it. That poses the challenge in a new form, which Achinstein takes up in this book: how does the definition of "evidence" help thinking about any actual science?[2]

Achinstein's answer is to turn from evidence to method. In the work of Newton and Maxwell, he finds the inspiration for rules of method that allow scientists to find evidence (when it is available) or make progress toward evidence (when it is not).

Achinstein spends most of Chapter 1 explaining his account of evidence. He covers familiar ground, developing the account in relation to some desiderata and against some alternatives. Although there is nothing new here for readers already familiar with his view, the chapter does not presuppose any prior knowledge and works fine as a short introduction to his account.[3] On Achinstein's view, an empirical datum or phenomenon (e) counts as "potential evidence" for an hypothesis (h) if and only if

1. It is reasonable to think that there is an explanatory relation between e and h,
2. e is true,
3. e does not entail h.

On the further conditions that h is actually true and that there actually is an explanatory relation between e and h, e counts as "strong veridical evidence" for h. When scientists make evidential claims, according to Achinstein, they offer what they take to be strong veridical evidence.

Chapter 2 begins with the four methodological rules offered by Isaac Newton in the third book of the Principia. Achinstein discusses some of the arguments in which Newton invokes them. The rules, Achinstein suggests, serve not to justify steps in Newton's arguments but instead as guides to formulating and establishing general laws on the basis of phenomena. They are "more like rules of strategy than rules of inference" (p. 67).

Although he discusses other thinkers' interpretations of Newton, Achinstein is ultimately not concerned with arguing exegesis. Rather, he aims to give an account which "yields rules that are reasonable and that reflects many of Newton's ideas" (p. 67). So he offers four generalized rules which are inspired by Newton's. The rules themselves are lengthy (see pp. 68-9), but the gist of them is to look for empirical confirmation of would-be causes, to posit the same cause for effects of the same kind "so far as empirically possible", to make causal identifications as general as possible, and to accept a law established in this way as at least approximately true. (Regrettably, I remove much subtlety by summarizing them in one sentence.) At the beginning of Chapter 3, Achinstein adds a fifth rule: Once some general causes have been identified, predict and check phenomena that would arise from the combination of these causes.

The bulk of Chapter 3 is a lengthy attack on Inference to the Best Explanation (IBE) as a rival account of evidence and method. Achinstein makes the familiar complaint that there is no reason to think that a lovelier explanation is more likely to be true than an unlovely one, so IBE alone is no guide to the truth. He grounds this in the deeper objection that loveliness of an explanation, as it is usually understood, is an a priori relation between explanans and explananda. Contrariwise, on Achinstein's account, evidential relations are empirical. He ultimately concedes, however, that we might want explanations that are lovely in an a priori way. So he formulates a combination strategy: Follow the five rules for finding general laws, "doing so in such a way as to produce the 'loveliest' system you can" (p. 114).

This underscores the extent to which Achinstein's rules of method are merely pragmatic. As rules of strategy, they are guides to accomplishing such-and-so given that it is your aim. Although he says that looking for lovely explanations is "a perfectly good aim" (p. 114), a combination strategy might be formulated with whatever extra aim you think is charming. And the five rules themselves are only relevant if you share Newton's aim "to establish a general causal law" (p. 79, 116). I will return to this point in a moment.

Chapter 4 treats several papers by James Clerk Maxwell. In the first of these (from 1855) Maxwell gives a mathematically precise description of electric fields by exploiting an analogy between fields and fluid flow through tiny tubes. The point of the analogy is not to suggest that the electric field literally is the flow of some electric fluid, but instead to organize various electrical phenomena in a precise way and make the laws vivid so that they can be taught more easily. This "method of physical analogy", Achinstein suggests, is a useful strategy for accomplishing these aims.

In the second paper (from 1860), Maxwell derives consequences from the assumption that gases are comprised of spherical molecules. Achinstein gives special attention to the derivation of the Maxwell Distribution, the distribution of particle velocities in a gas. He notes that the entire approach involves many assumptions that are not established empirically, underscoring that Maxwell's derivations cannot justify their conclusions. Instead, Achinstein suggests, they serve as a proof of possibility, "showing how it is possible to understand the behavior of gasses by reference to mechanical causes" (p. 153).

In the third paper (from 1875), Maxwell aims to do more, offering positive reasons to think that the molecular theory might be true. The assumptions required for the argument are not merely presumed in order to facilitate computation but instead enjoy what Achinstein calls "independent warrant" (p. 161). He concludes that the arguments provide "less than proof but more than possibility", not knowledge but a "confident but less than perfect belief state" (pp. 169, 170).[4]

Achinstein portrays the three papers as models for strategic rules that further the aims of advancing theory development (when matters are as yet too obscure to apply the Newtonian rules) and furthering completeness and precision. Here again, he articulates method as strategic rules that presume some determinate aims. His account of evidence also involves a claim about scientists' aims, namely that scientists typically intend to provide strongly veridical evidence when they make claims for or against hypotheses. Unfortunately, Achinstein does not situate the aims that are served by various strategic rules (to find general laws, to find lovely explanations, to develop a theory, to express claims precisely) in relation to this overarching aim of evidence. If the connection could be made, then it might give a direct reply to the Dean's Challenge.

Regarding Maxwell: It is not clear that Achinstein intends for there to be such a connection at all. The methods, he suggests, are useful just when "you don't have evidence sufficient to establish a theory, or . . . any theory at all to establish" (p. xiv).

Regarding Newton: Achinstein argues that someone who has followed these rules will have acquired evidence in his sense. This still does not answer the Dean's Challenge, though, because it does not show that there is any use thinking in terms of evidence. It shows only that, once the rules are applied, the philosopher's account of evidence is satisfied.

Here Achinstein relies on a subtlety in his Newtonian rules. The second rule is not an injunction to always attribute the same cause to the same effect but only "so far as empirically possible". Whether it is empirically possible or not will depend on the details and cannot be dictated by general methods. Even just recognizing the same kind of effect requires having enough knowledge of the phenomena to group events into kinds of effects. Achinstein writes:

The rule only urges you to try to generalize inductively if you can, meaning if you are empirically warranted in doing so. Whether you are so warranted will depend on empirical facts about the class of bodies observed (how many, how varied, etc.) It is such facts that will give you epistemic justification for inferring the generalization, not the rule. (p. 78)

He thus allies himself with what John Norton has called "material theories of induction":that ampliative inference always turns on specific empirical background knowledge, rather than on some generalprinciple.[5]

This appeal to material theories of induction strikes me as the right move to make. However, if there is no general and informative formula for ampliative inference, then why won't the same be true for evidence? The crucial work of evidence is done by knowledge of particular, empirical facts rather than by the general formula. But Achinstein's account of evidence is general and formal! Scientists' needs cannot be answered by such a general account, and so we are left without an answer to the Dean's Challenge after all.

Perhaps this just points to my dissatisfaction with the Dean's Challenge as a framing device. Achinstein can be read as sketching method and mentioning evidence, but as ultimately relying on context-bound empirical warrant. Although he does not have much to say about the details of warrant here, the discussion of method is still worth the time to read it. It is pleasant reading, and I commend it to anyone who is curious about the lessons that might be drawn from Newton and Maxwell or about the strategic conception of method that Achinstein sketches.

[1] The challenge first appeared as the framing device for Achinstein's The Book of Evidence, Oxford University Press, 2001.

[2] Achinstein attributes this still-unsatisfied image of the Dean to Philip Kitcher, whom he quotes at length (pp. 39-40); see Kitcher, "On the very idea of a theory of evidence" in Philosophy of Science Matters: The Philosophy of Peter Achinstein, Gregory J. Morgan (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2011, pp. 84-95.

[3] The account is developed in more detail in Achinstein's The Book of Evidence, and the précis here is similar to the one he gives in "Evidence", his contribution to The Routledge Companion to Philosophy of Science, Stathis Psillos and Martin Curd (eds.), Routledge, 2008, pp. 337-348.

[4] This conclusion puzzles me. As a fallibilist, I think perfect belief states would be pathological. So I don't see the difference between where Maxwell is delivered by his third-paper method and whereNewton is delivered by his. Perhaps there is this much: Newton can be confident that his general laws are at least approximately true. Maxwell's belief in molecules cannot be qualified in this way because existence, unlike laws, can't be approximate.

[5] See John Norton, "A Material Theory of Induction", Philosophy of Science 70 (4), October 2003: pp. 647-70, which Achinstein approvingly cites (p. 117).