Evidence and Religious Belief

Placeholder book cover

Kelly James Clark and Raymond J. VanArragon (eds.), Evidence and Religious Belief, Oxford University Press, 2011, 214pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603718.

Reviewed by Trent Dougherty, Baylor University


This excellent collection is more evidence of the renewal of interest in things evidential in both general and religious epistemology. For the sake of space considerations, I will focus on the first two sections of the book, which are more methodological -- examining the role of evidence in religious belief -- whereas the third of the three sections of the book contains arguments for and against religious belief.

Part I, "Exploring the Demand for Evidence," begins with the late James Ross's essay "Willing Belief and Rational Faith." Ross takes evidentialism to be a thesis about knowledge to the effect that "a person is always unjustified . . . in claiming to know something for which he has insufficient evidence to assure" (18). We can read "claims" as "takes oneself" to make it broader, and I'll bracket "to assure" since I'm unsure of its function. Evidentialism is primarily a thesis about justification, but the natural expansion takes knowledge to entail justification, so Ross's evidentialism -- as defined -- is not a caricature. However, the basis of his rejection of it is puzzling. He claims that it fails because it "is itself not evidentially justifiable, as Plantinga pointed out. It cannot be established a priori by revealing a contradictory denial . . . or inductively" (18). This is strange because evidentialism doesn't say anything about the need to be justified in those ways. True, at one point Plantinga attributed this requirement to a form of classical foundationalism (sadly not mentioning how rare such a view is today, nor mentioning the slough of moderate foundationalisms now in existence), but these two issues should be separated. 

The second reason Ross gives for rejecting evidentialism is that it clashes with a concept of faith which exhibits Ross's characteristic erudition and creativity. He proposes a theory of knowledge quite reminiscent of Sosa's (14-15). He then draws a conclusion essentially the same as Plantinga in Warranted Christian Belief that Christian belief, if true, is also warranted (15, 21). He seems to embrace something like both Sosa's "animal knowledge" as well as "reflective knowledge" and, in the latter case, a relation not unlike coherence but expressed in terms of "clustered reliances" serves to justify belief. This, of course, makes linear argument for justification hard if not impossible to come by. But he says that every large-scale ideology is like this, including the secular faiths that disdain religion. I think his remarks are very interesting and well worth following up (it is a very short chapter), but it seems perfectly compatible with a reasonable evidentialism.

Ross briefly touches on a theme which is taken up by William Wainwright in more detail in Chapter 5, the first chapter in Part II, "The Relation of Beliefs to Evidence." Wainwright begins by surveying the historical use of theistic arguments and exploring the notion of a "person-relative" proof in the work of George Mavrodes (to whom the book is dedicated). He then turns his attention to John Schellenberg's claim that Christian conviction which exceeds the strength of the evidence is faulty and in a way vicious for putting loyalty to a person (God) before loyalty to the truth. Wainwright's response is to attack what he considers Schellenberg's "enlightenment" view of reason.

There is a sense, for both Ross and Wainwright, in which the anti-religious skeptic has taken the injunction "Believe truth, shun error" and given much more weight to the latter half than to the former. This is connected in Wainwright's discussion -- though I'm unsure of the conceptual connection -- with the question whether truth and rationality can "come apart," which seems to come to the question whether one's total evidence can ever point on balance to a falsehood. Mavrodes, he reports, would go with truth over rationality. But though Wainwright closes his chapter -- by suggesting that his interim meditations cast doubt on the very possibility of truth and rationality coming apart (does he deny fallibilism?) -- he does not connect the dots in any explicit way. The intervening discussion is a defense of passionally inflected reason: allowing conative features to influence what it is rational to believe. Note this passage: "neutrality, understood as bracketing, or prescinding from, what James calls our 'willing' or 'passional' nature, is reasonable only upon the assumption that that nature isn't truth oriented" (91). First, the literature on cognitive biases and heuristics seems to indicate that sometimes nature is truth-oriented and sometimes it's not. Thus it seems a "passional reason" approach is committed to some empirical research for an adequate defense. Second, insofar as conative elements are truth oriented -- or signs of truth -- they count as evidence, and so nothing he says is in any tension with a reasonable evidentialism.

C. Stephen Evans (Chapter 3, Part I) also presents a moderate view in which the notion of a natural sign is used to give both evidentialism and reformed epistemology their due. This chapter is in part a précis of some of the main lines of argument in his recent Natural Signs and Knowledge of God (OUP). But he presents his view with attention to ways in which it was prefigured by and in a sense completes the work of Mavrodes. The essay has three parts. Evans begins (Sections 1-4) with an account of Mavrodes' views on experience, including a fascinating discussion on directness and indirectness in experience. In Section 5, he presents a brief version of his theory of natural signs and knowledge of God. Finally, in Section 6, he illustrates the approach with the example of the moral argument for God's existence. This whirlwind tour might leave the reader wishing for more detail, but, thankfully for them, they can find it by reading Evans's book.

The core idea behind the natural signs approach is this. Something ubiquitous and pervasive in nature evokes in humans a tendency to see the world order as the creation of a divine mind. Nature contains signs that point people's minds to God. The skeptic may argue that these signs are misleading -- and there are attempts in the cognitive psychology of religion to do so, which Evans addresses in his larger work -- but what the skeptic would then be doing is arguing that a certain bit of evidence the theist has for theism is misleading evidence. But that critique already acknowledges that these natural signs are prima facie evidence for God. Evans notes explicitly that it is sensible to think of these natural signs as evidence (45). He then goes on to present a picture of the traditional theistic arguments as attempts to unpack these signs and render their epistemic significance available to reflective reason and even to regiment the logic to various degrees. The wonderfully humane bit of application here -- and it goes back to the person-relativity of Mavrodes which Wainwright mentions -- is the fact that the function of these arguments will vary widely by person. For certain people in certain epistemic environments, the proofs may be completely superfluous. Others might find them quite helpful. Still others might find them necessary to sustain their faith. This is surely so, and philosophers of religion of all stripes would do well to take this to heart.

Tom Crisp's very clear and crisp essay is an interesting attempt to convert Plantinga's Evolutionary Argument Against Naturalism into a reply from the argument against theism from evil. The basic idea is that if Naturalism is true then evolution is unguided and so there is little reason to trust the deliverances of Reason when they are far removed from ordinary life. According to the Naturalist's picture, our cognitive faculties evolved in a milieu where there would have been no advantage to the kind of theorizing which is at work in the argument from evil (the key premise of which Crisp labels as a piece of recondite philosophy). In short, we ought to at best suspend judgment about whether our cognitive faculties are reliable when it comes to recondite matters of philosophy, far removed from ordinary life. The discussions of the nature of defeat and higher-order evidence alone make this chapter a rewarding read.

There are two weaknesses in Crisp's argument, one material, one methodological. Whether faculties responsible for philosophical views are reliable is an empirical question. Here is a toy theory. As a response to the multivariate challenges of life on the African savannah 300,000 million years ago (or whatever), archaic homo sapiens acquired the trait of having a faculty of inference to the best explanation. Then, 300,000 million years hence, this same faculty delivered the key premise of the argument from evil. Nothing Crisp says raises any doubts about this kind of scenario and though it is a toy model, there are more advanced extant versions.

Another lacuna related to the IBE point is that Crisp ignores a relevant version of what I've called the Common Sense Problem of Evil: It just seems obvious that certain evils could have no justification. And this isn't necessarily a piece of recondite philosophy (we cannot conclude that something is a piece of recondite philosophy just because it commits one to a piece of recondite philosophy). It is simply the application of commonsense moral intuitions. That it is not justifiable to torture kittens for fun is not a recondite piece of philosophy. It's common sense. It's also common sense that the more resources a person has, the less likely it is that they are stuck with bad options. And the idea that God was stuck with the options of the Holocaust or something at least as bad can seem absurd. Crisp has not provided an argument here that such judgments are likely unreliable given unguided evolution.

E.J. Coffman and Jeff Cervantez offer a careful critique of one of the most creative attempts by an analytic philosopher to engage philosophy of religion: Paul Moser's recent work in the epistemology of religion, centered on hiddenness. They consider three of Moser's arguments against the following key premise of the argument against theism from divine hiddenness.

Spectator Evidence Assumption (SEA) A cognitively normal adult human would be justified in believing that God exists only if she had adequate spectator evidence that God exists.

Spectator evidence is "evidence for God's existence you can acquire without thereby being called by God to submit to a morally transformative relationship with him" (96). (It is not clear to me that Schellenberg should accept this restriction, but I'll set that aside.) The first of Moser's arguments against SEA -- The Spirit of God Argument -- has as key premises:

1.     You couldn't doubt that there is a cognitively reliable relation between your experiencing the presence of God's spirit and the proposition God exists.

2.     For anything other than that you could.

Coffman and Cervantez say that 2 is false because there are clearly valid arguments for God's existence. I think this misses the point and not just because entailment isn't the relevant kind of cognitive relation. The point, I take it, is just that we would not be psychologically capable of doubting that you were experiencing God when you do so the way Moser has in mind, while all good fallibilists will admit that one can in fact doubt entailments.

One of Moser's arguments -- the Purposively Available Evidence Argument -- has as a premise the following:

If one of God's main aims for you were that you freely submit to a morally transformative relationship with him, then your having adequate evidence for his existence would involve your receiving 'an evident authoritative call to volitional fellowship with God.'

Coffman and Cervantez argue that this is false, because one could have testimonial knowledge that there is a God. They think this a good strategy because Moser considers "people transparently in volitional fellowship with God . . . a living sign, even birthing and speaking evidence" (101-2). But their model of testimonial knowledge where someone "tells . . . Bob . . . some important things about God" (102) falls woefully short of the phenomenon Moser surely has in mind. So, though Coffman and Cervantez's reading is very careful in one way, it seems to show a lack of the knack for reading what the author is trying to say.

Another very careful essay is Chris Tucker's "Phenomenal Conservatism and Evidentialism in Religious Epistemology." This is the longest chapter in the book, and deserves its own review! It contains a fair amount of straight-up epistemology. I am in very broad agreement with his approach, which I've been defending for many years, so any criticism would be in the details. He applies the notion of phenomenal conservatism -- that seemings that p provide evidence for p (55) -- to religious belief. If it seems to S that God exists and loves her, then she has a reason to believe this. This is more plausible than the proper functionalist idea that any old experience can support a belief as long as the right kind of design plan maps that belief on to that experience. But Tucker envisions "re-describing the role for the sensus divinitatus" (62) as the thing which maps bare sensations onto seeming states. I have always thought that the right use of proper function was in an account of proper basing. Though Tucker doesn't suggest this, it seems a natural fit with what he says. Tucker is in a way fleshing out a version of the strategy Chisholm mentioned (1966, 67/1977, 132ff) for securing internalist non-inferential knowledge of God. I have been wanting to do this for years, and I am glad it has been ably done by Tucker.

Interestingly, two chapters treat an argument which was once a mainstay of theistic arguments but which hasn't received much attention in a very long while: the consensus gentium argument. This argument suggests that widespread belief in God epistemically supports belief in God. Linda Zagzebski grounds the argument in her current research in epistemic self trust. The main line of the argument is admirably clear (summarized on p. 34). The key premises are:

  1. Every person must have a general attitude of self-trust in her epistemic faculties as a whole.
  2. The general attitude of self-trust commits us to a general attitude of epistemic trust in the faculties of all other human beings.

The main reason for 2 is based on others' similarities to ourselves, so I will focus on 1, since if these two are granted, the rest is pretty straightforward (comparatively).

My main concern is with the "must." Must for what? Zagzebski also begins her essay with this language: "the natural desire for truth makes epistemic self-trust a requirement" (22). Again, a requirement for what? What she says in the section "The need for self-trust" focuses on the fact that self-trust -- the core content of which she takes to be treating as reliable and believing to be reliable (25) -- is "pre-reflective" and natural. Yet she doesn't go on to argue that this property makes the belief more likely to be true. She mentions repeatedly the importance of the assumption that our efforts to get to truth can be effective. This leads to a discussion of epistemic conscientiousness. It appears to me that this virtue is what we need the assumption of self-reliability for. (27) This, of course, raises the question of what reason we have to believe this virtue effective. I don't know whether she envisions some kind of doxastic practices approach here or not, but much of what she says leans that way (even to the point of something like Wittgensteinian entitlement theory). It will be interesting to see where this goes.

As I said at the outset, there is not space to consider the third section of the book, which contains arguments for and against the existence of God. However, since Thomas Kelly also treats the rarely treated consensus gentium argument, I will say just a few words about his essay. I only want to note that he does an excellent job of replying to two objections. To the objection that -- to put it crudely -- atheists are smarter than theists, he brackets the question of the truth of this claim and instead offers a model according to which it completely depends on the second objection: that there is too much dependence among believers, since most religious beliefs are formed in response to common sources and in communities with common influence. To this objection Kelly notes that there is much more independence in the persistence of religious beliefs and mentions important parallels where lack of initial dependence does not reduce the evidential value of widespread belief.

Kelly's chapter is followed by an essay by Kelly James Clark and Andrew Samuel, "Morality and Happiness," which criticizes contractarian accounts of moral motivation -- specifically Gauthier's -- and argues that theism would do better. They consider this as part of an overall explanatory case for theism. There follows a chapter by William Rowe which is a slightly updated précis of his arguments in Can God Be Free? The book ends with an exchange between William Hasker and John Hick on a previous set of exchanges between Hick and Mavrodes on religious pluralism and "polytheism."

I have only a couple of general criticisms. It is a bit annoying to still hear the complaint that classical foundationalism has "self-referential difficulties" because it "cannot be justified by its own standards" (4). Such theories are taken to be conceptual or otherwise necessary truths or synthetic a priori. Also, I wish the introduction would have done more to highlight the many varying definitions of "evidentialism" which float about in religious epistemology. For example, the claim that "we have two positions, evidentialism and reformed epistemology, offering opposing answers to the central question of whether religious belief must be based on evidence in order to be rational" (3) presupposes Plantinga's definition -- which he admits would have better been called "evidentialism with respect to belief in God" (Plantinga 2000, 70) which -- unlike the evidentialism developed in Conee and Feldman 2004 -- requires evidence to be propositional and argumentative. The fact is evidentialism is more of a research project than a single doctrine (See Dougherty 2011). Fortunately, the introduction does go on to make crucial distinctions and winds up at least seemingly endorsing a modest rapprochement between "reformed" and "enlightenment" epistemology. This spirit of rapprochement is one of the best things about the book.

All and all this is a very stimulating book with a nice balance of positions and much reflection on the methodological aspects of religious epistemology. I will almost certainly be using it in a graduate seminar in the Fall.


Chisholm, Roderick (1966/1977), Theory of Knowledge (2nd/3rd Edition), Prentice Hall.

Conee, Earl and Feldman, Richard (2004), Evidentialism: Essays in Epistemology, Oxford.

Dougherty, Trent (2011), Evidentialism and Its Discontents, Oxford.

Plantinga, Alvin (2000), Warranted Christian Belief, Oxford.