Evidentialism and the Will to Believe

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Scott F. Aikin, Evidentialism and the Will to Believe, Bloomsbury, 2014, 214pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781623560171.

Reviewed by Andrew D. Cling, The University of Alabama in Huntsville


Scott Aikin provides an analysis and evaluation of William Clifford’s case for evidentialism and William James’ alternative. He puts issues in context, carefully reconstructs the arguments, and offers detailed critical commentary. He also gives a spirited original defense of evidentialism. He writes with clarity and verve, and his discussion is uniformly insightful. The book is filled with telling examples, useful distinctions, trenchant arguments, and good humor. I recommend it with enthusiasm. There are three chapters: one on Clifford, one on James, and one on religion and the ethics of belief, which contains Aikin’s own defense of evidentialism. The book is full of arguments that are worthy of sustained attention. I discuss only a few issues.

Clifford and James give moral arguments for their accounts of the conditions under which belief is permissible. Clifford holds that believing is always morally impermissible unless one has sufficient evidence. James holds that there are conditions under which it is morally permissible to believe a proposition that is not supported by sufficient evidence. These conditions are satisfied, according to James, by some religious propositions.

Here is Clifford’s key evidentialist principle: “it is wrong, always, everywhere, and for any one to believe anything on insufficient evidence” (48). In light of Clifford’s epistemological and ethical commitments, Aikin restates this principle as the Integrated Evidentialist Rule:

(IER): If any subject (S) believes any proposition (p) at any time (t), then S has properly done so only if: (i) S has sufficient evidence at t that p is true, and (ii) all doubts S has had (and should have) regarding p‘s truth or falsity have been investigated so that there are no truths S could have easily discovered that would have affected S’s evidence. (49-50)

Two problems with IER are that it is not clear what the relevant evidence is supposed to be sufficient for and it is not clear whether ‘evidence’ refers to factors that are positively related to truth or only to factors that believers take to be positively related to truth. Aikin does not sort this out.

My guess is that IER is most plausible if we take sufficient evidence to be evidence that is sufficient to make P more likely than not-P. This leaves it undecided whether ‘evidence’ refers to actual or to putative evidence. The former seems to be required if IER is to promote having true beliefs while avoiding false beliefs. The latter seems to be required if IER is to capture a necessary condition of moral responsibility. IER prohibits both epistemic insolence — believing contrary to the evidence one has — and epistemic sloth — believing contrary to readily available evidence one ought to have (25-27). Since IER implies that the permissibility of belief can be affected by evidence and doubts that one does not but should have, IER is not compatible with an internalist account of permissible belief according to which the permissibility of one’s beliefs supervenes only on facts about one’s present mental states. This is a problem for a theory that is supposed to provide principles that guide inquiry and capture conditions on the normative status of beliefs. Just how, for example, can thinkers be responsible for reasons for doubt they lack but should have had? How can persons be responsible to evidence they do not take to be evidence? This is a problem for Clifford since he urges that scientific evidence trumps putative evidence for religious belief.

Clifford’s case for evidentialism starts with the claim that beliefs held without sufficient evidence explain the irresponsibility of actions in high-stakes cases. Clifford considers a ship owner who squelches his doubts about a vessel’s seaworthiness, ignores evidence against seaworthiness, foregoes repairs, and lets the ship sail to its doom. The ship owner acts irresponsibly because his belief in the seaworthiness of the ship is not based on sufficient evidence. Clifford thinks the lessons from such high-stakes cases generalize to all cases because even apparently innocuous false propositions allowed into a system of beliefs damage one’s ability to identify other truths (the content argument (34-36)) and the habit of believing on the basis of insufficient evidence is liable to let in false, high-stakes beliefs (the habit slide) (37-41). The habit can also infect other people (39-40).

These arguments appear to be consequentialist: belief on the basis of insufficient evidence is impermissible because believing on the basis of evidence is our best guide to truth and false beliefs can have catastrophic consequences. Aikin claims, however, that Clifford holds that what we are obligated to do is not a function of the consequences of our actions. For example, Clifford holds that true beliefs for which we have insufficient evidence are blameworthy even when the consequences of holding them are good (20). The key to reconciling Clifford’s apparently consequentialist arguments with his deontology, says Aikin, is to recognize that Clifford is a neo-stoic; “stoic deontology is more a mixed view, one that integrates consequences of actions as ways of determining role duties” (45). The idea here, I take it, is that the consequences of types of actions are used to individuate the duties that one has in virtue of one’s roles, and those duties determine one’s responsibility in particular cases. The permissibility of an act token, however, is not a function of its actual consequences. Or perhaps that is not the idea. Aikin’s claim that Clifford’s stoic deontology reconciles his apparently consequentialist arguments with his deontological ethics is interesting, but opaque.

Evidentialism is vulnerable in the case of beliefs that seem to play an essential role in guiding the ways we manage evidence. For it seems that there are beliefs we must have in order to reason by means of evidence that cannot themselves be supported by evidence-providing reasons. For example, some principle must underwrite non-demonstrative inferences from the observed to the unobserved: that nature is uniform, that the unobserved resembles the observed, that using induction from the observed to identify truths about the unobserved is reliable, or some such thing. Yet, as Hume argues, such principles are not self-evident and, as Aikin notes, “Without assuming the uniformity of nature, no experience or aggregation of them could be evidence of the uniformity beyond them” (70, my emphasis). This, I suggest, is because such principles constrain the functions from what we take to be evidence to the propositions for which we take it to be evidence. It matters what factors we take to be evidence. It also matters what propositions we take those factors to be evidence for. Given different constraints, the very same factors would be “evidence” for contrary propositions. So, for example, if counterinduction is correct, the unobserved does not resemble the observed. Because of this, the very same factors would be evidence for a principle of induction and for a principle of counterinduction — the unobserved does not resemble the observed — by their own lights. That induction, not counterinduction, has been reliable in the past is evidence that induction will be reliable in the future, if induction is reliable. It is also evidence that counterinduction will be reliable in the future, if counterinduction is reliable. If, as seems plausible, the results of a method for identifying truths cannot be good evidence-providing reasons for the reliability of that very method, we have insufficient evidence to believe that induction is reliable. Yet it seems we must be committed to its reliability in order to reason in accordance with the norms of common sense and science. This seems to be a major problem for the IER.

Aikin works hard to show that Clifford can solve this problem. The reply turns on two claims: (i) there can be no evidence against a principle to the effect that the unobserved resembles the observed (because a uniformity principle is required for systematic inquiry of any sort), and (ii) the principle can be understood as a prescriptive rule for the direction of inquiry (72-78). Each of these claims is problematic. Claim (i) assumes that only induction is reliable and so begs the question in favor of one understanding of ‘evidence’: counterinduction is supported, by its own lights, by the same evidence. Claim (ii) dodges the problem by making the principle of induction a prescriptive rule, the sort of thing that one can follow but not the sort of thing that one can believe. This is also problematic. It is true that we can follow rules for inquiry without having beliefs about those rules. But if merely following the rules that govern inductive methods of inquiry is sufficient for responsible inquiry, reflective inquirers who believe that the rules are reliable will be guilty of impermissible belief while unreflective rule followers are in the clear. Furthermore, it would be arbitrary from one’s own point of view to follow one rule for inquiry and not another without having a good reason to prefer it. So it is unreasonable to trust a method of inquiry without a good reason to believe that it is reliable. Even if it were true, as both Hume and Clifford insist, that as a matter of fact we have no option but to reason in ways that conform to the rules of induction — the wide range of belief-forming practices seems to show that this is false — this is not the same thing as believing on the basis of sufficient evidence. So it seems that beliefs about the reliability of the methods of inquiry that Clifford recommends resist being supported by the kind of evidence the IER requires. It might, as Aikin urges, be possible to provide non-evidential, practical reasons for such beliefs, but this does not show that they are permissible on evidentialist grounds. Such non-evidential, practical reasons for belief are the very things that James’ anti-evidentialism recommends.

James’ anti-evidentialism is limited: we are obligated to believe only propositions for which we have sufficient evidence except in cases in which evidence is unable to decide between competing propositions and the truth of the target propositions somehow depends on what we believe. Aikin provides detailed and thorough guidance through the big thicket of conditions that must be satisfied, according to James, if it is permissible to believe a proposition without having sufficient evidence. Here is Aikin’s version of James’ crucial principle:

WTB*: If S has option O:(p, q) [the doxastic option between hypotheses p and q] and O:(p, q) is (a) genuine, (b) rationally undecidable, © [S] has a preferable option of the two, and (d) the preferable option is doxastically dependent, then S may and must decide the option on the basis of S’s passional nature. (154)

Aikin takes James’ argument for WTB* to be that there are evidentially undecidable cases in which it would be plainly foolish to withhold belief and the reasonableness of believing in the absence of sufficient evidence in such cases is explained by conditions (a)-(d). In these cases the target proposition P is such that rejecting and withholding P have the same consequences for action (hence the choice is forced) and believing that P would increase the probability that P is true (hence P is doxastically dependent).

One such case is the Alpine Climber from James’ essay “The Sentiment of Rationality.” The climber can survive only if he completes a dangerous leap, his evidence that the leap will succeed is counterbalanced by the evidence against it, believing that the leap will not succeed and suspending judgment both lead to failure, and a successful leap is made more likely by the climber’s believing in success. Under these conditions it seems that the climber has good non-evidential reasons to believe that he will make a successful leap despite having insufficient evidence. So, James concludes, there are cases of responsible belief that WTB* explains but IER does not.

Aikin is unpersuaded. He thinks that the Alpine Climber case is not a counterexample to IER since, once the climber believes that he will make a successful leap, he does have sufficient evidence that the leap will succeed because the belief itself tilts the evidential balance in favor of success (153). A problem with this reply is that even if the climber does increase the evidence for a successful jump by believing that the jump will succeed, this belief need not be based on the evidence that it partly constitutes. It is not as though the climber forms the belief on the grounds that, once he does so, he will have sufficient evidence for the target proposition: he believes because of his desire to succeed. That such basing reasons are important to James is indicated in a passage quoted by Aikin: “In truths dependent on our personal action, faith based on desire is certainly lawful and possibly an indispensable thing.” (160, Aikin’s emphasis).

There are cases in the neighborhood that avoid Aikin’s reply whether or not basing reasons are in play. Suppose Mighty Casey hits .450 when he believes I will get a hit but bats only .350 when he rejects or withholds this proposition. Since it is important for Mighty Casey to get a hit, and he can increase the probability of this outcome by believing in it, it seems that Mighty Casey has a good non-evidential reason to believe I will get a hit despite the fact that the evidence is against it whether or not he believes he will get a hit. For, in this case, believing I will get a hit increases the likelihood of a hit even though it remains likelier that he does not get a hit. If IER is true, however, Mighty Casey’s belief is impermissible. Unfortunately, WTB* does not help in this case since James apparently thinks that IER is prima facie correct and that WTB* applies only in cases of counterbalanced evidence.

Why is James so conservative? Perhaps his commitment to IER except in cases of counterbalanced evidence is grounded in his moderate pragmatism about the nature of belief — beliefs guide action, but they also function to represent states of affairs — and in a correlative notion to the effect that, whatever else the function of belief is, believing is permissible only if it is at least partly guided by the goal of representing the truth. One way to break the spell of this way of thinking would be to adopt a more radical pragmatic conception of belief and reject the representational function and the correlative view that truth must be a goal of inquiry. Another way would be to grant that beliefs are, by their nature, representational and that we ought to care about having true beliefs, but that this commitment is sometimes trumped by other values. This might sacrifice the idea that there is a single principle for the ethics of belief, but that seems preferable both to radical pragmatism and to the idea that evidence alone determines the permissibility of belief.

The book contains a wide range of interesting arguments and insights that I have not examined. I hope that my discussion of some of its central concerns will encourage others to read it.