Exceptional Technologies: A Continental Philosophy of Technology

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Dominic Smith, Exceptional Technologies: A Continental Philosophy of Technology, Bloomsbury, 2018, 169pp., $88.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350015609.

Reviewed by Robert C. Scharff, University of New Hampshire


Dominic Smith's book starts with a critical review of recent work in technoscience studies, especially work associated with the so-called empirical turn in Continental philosophy of technology [CPT]. In the 1990s when this movement was young, its opposition to the abstract and essentialist elements of classical CPT, together with its call for careful study of actual technologies instead, felt just right. Classical CPT was depicted as a first wave phenomenon -- a pioneering legacy that undoubtedly pushed inquiry in the proper direction by stressing the key role of artifacts in current technoscientific life but was also deeply burdened by a general tendency toward either happy progressivist scientism or nostalgia, romanticism, and overblown worries about technology as an autonomous force. As its progeny saw it, classical CPT committed a fallacy of reification. Their "transcendentalist tales of Technology Überhaupt largely ignored particular technological experiences in favor of universalizing expressions of technological optimism (i.e., Saint-Simon, Comte, and the French Utopians, 20th century positivists, maybe Marx) or pessimism (i.e., Rousseau, Nietzsche, their 21st century children, Ortega y Gasset, Jaspers, Mumford, Ellul, and above all Heidegger). In the end, a forced option seemed unavoidable. Either stay with the high-altitude theorizers of Technology, "refrain from addressing concrete technological practices and developments, and fail . . . to appreciate how these can rapidly alter the actual normative frameworks of culture." Or descend into technological reality, "stand in the middle of the world of designers and users . . . make abundant use of [multidisciplinary] research . . . [and] communicate directly with technologists and engineers."[1]

Yet forced options are more often the stuff of logic than life; and after two decades, it is now clear that the very idea of turning involves a reification of its own. As Smith puts it, the turners bragged about avoiding a transcendentalism they defined in a way that is just as abstract and empty as the idea of the technological they claimed to find among classical CPT (29). Moreover, this second reification is actually worse. In making their enemy one-dimensional and straw man-like, they made another set of equally transcendental but much more elusive ideas embedded in the very conception of an empirical turn much harder to recognize. For it is one thing to learn to stay clear of universalizing theories. As everybody knows, Mere Ideas are less valuable than Actual Stuff. But it takes a much more diligent self-awareness to see, let alone question, one's own received sense of what Actual Stuff there is, and how and why it is worth studying. This received sense is no explicit theory; rather, in its obviousness, it silently lives in and conditions our common-sense understanding of what technologies normally are and how to approach them. Technologies are never just concrete and individual in an empty and cipher-like way. In our own technoscientific times, they work, are useful, complex in design, forever being improved or replaced -- all in a specific manner that seems to collectively contribute to the development of an ever more thoroughly developed world, where progress promises to be endless as long as we let science guide us and make the right choices about its applications. All of this constitutes a generally understood condition for the possibility of 21st century existence as we live-through and conceptualize it. And all of this, argues Smith, is what CPT should be critically analyzing, not noisily suppressing behind obvious-sounding calls for empiricism and anti-essentialism.

Smith's unique approach to this issue gives his book its title. He sees enormous philosophical potential in analyzing what he calls exceptional technologies, by which he means

artefacts and practices that appear as marginal or paradoxical exceptions to a received sense of what empirically constitutes a technology in a given context . . . but that can nevertheless act as important focal points for drawing out and challenging conditions implicated in the received sense (5).

Analysis of the exceptional has the power to disrupt and thus illuminate the common-sense, liberal-progressivist, conditioning sense of technoscientific life that is widely presupposed by advocates of the empirical turn. Of course, unexceptional technologies can initially pose challenges, too, but they eventually acquire a more comfortable place in the normal order of things. For example, radical design changes take time to get used to, and the unexpected consequences of new technologies may at first seem to speak against their use.

With exceptional technologies, however, normalization is not possible. In Chapter 4, Smith presents three case studies that show ways in which this might be so -- because a technology can only be imagined (e.g., Vannevar Bush's "memex"), because it inevitably fails for internal reasons (e.g., Francis Galton's composite photography), or because it is radically impracticable (e.g., Arthur Ganson's "Machine with Concrete"). For example, Galton's attempt to produce composite photographs that identify types of individuals and groups was hopelessly flawed, but in ways that involve precisely the same sort of philosophical problems we still face concerning the design and use of devices for facial recognition, bioimaging, and data visualization. Like Galton's, our current efforts also confront the dangers of circularity regarding criteria employed in database population, automation bias in the interpretation of bioimages, and biopositivism regarding the degree to which vision is an entirely measurable/quantifiable process (86-97).

As Smith indicates, Chapter 4 can be read as a standalone study; but it also forms the book's methodological centerpiece. In Chapter 5, for example, Smith interprets Foucault's account of Bentham's panopticon as an "exemplary attempt to 'map' an exceptional technology," illuminating among other things how the very rationale of its design (i.e., "consciousness of being constantly watched") carries inhumane socio-political implications that are likely to be missed -- to say nothing of criticized -- from an individualistic perspective (109-14, 121-24). Hence, Smith intends his case studies to serve as a model for exploiting the revelations of the technologically exceptional anywhere -- and in the book specifically, to critically correct for the empirical turn's overemphasis on the perspective of individuals dealing with particular artifacts. In the end, he says, this perspective is both epistemologically and socio-politically "too crudely first person, oppositional, and progressivist to help us engage complexities that go into shaping philosophy of technology as a field" (8, 32, 113); and that matters because this perspective is not confined to the work of a small band of 20th century followers of Hans Achterhuis. "Empirical turn" has become the watchword for a much broader philosophical movement whose "influence is . . . ongoing on a more fundamental level . . . in terms of the precedent it has set for turning as a key logic of innovation" in the philosophy of technology" (108). Smith therefore calls for a widening of CPT's outlook to include the full range of today's technoscientific conditions -- including the "political, aesthetic, economic, logical, epistemological, and ontological" -- that reconnects it with positive aspects of classical CPT that have been neglected by the empirical turn and that also links it up with all the other disciplines that have interests in these conditions (5, 8, 77-78).[2]

Smith's talk of conditions is deliberate. He thinks that advocates of the empirical turn, in their haste to make CPT concrete, have been insufficiently empirical. In dismissing all talk of general conditions of existence as abstract constructivism, they fail to notice that some such conditions are just as concretely experienced as any engagement with actual artifacts. That there always is a standard way of doing things -- that some practices always seem common-sensical and normal -- is just as empirical an aspect of technoscientific life as any artifact. Indeed, their own notion of a concrete approach to technoscientific life is itself the conceptualization of experienced yet transcendental conditions. The fact that some philosophers have falsely assumed that such conditions are timeless and essential means only that we would be better off treating the transcendental adjectivally rather than nominally (16). In other words, Smith's transcendental inquiry would ask about how things make sense, rather than trying to define their essences or study their causal history. Of course, such an inquiry would share the empirical turners' suspicions about ideas like technology itself, "the" philosophical way studying it, of philosophy's alleged authority to have the final say on such matters. Technoscientific life generally and the technologies of life specifically vary over time, change through and with our practices, and appear differently to mutually supplementing modes of study. "Empirical" and "transcendental" are thus neither static terms nor independently conceivable. Transcendental conditions possess "an enacted sense . . . that is always situated" and factually developing; hence, one should not choose between maintaining "an empirical focus on the specificity of artefacts, practices and problems [and seeking] . . . to open and vary the range of conditions in relation to which these practices can be considered" (53). Technoscientific life calls for a doubled and engaged sort of interpretation, at once empirical and transcendental.

Of course, even if his intentions are clear, Smith encourages readers to treat the book as a merely "partial and far from exhaustive" first step toward recasting the traditional idea of the transcendental (130). There is, however, one respect in which he seems to buy unnecessary trouble for developing this approach. His book is about CPT, but he also draws occasionally on analytic philosophy of technology (APT) -- including one way that seems incompatible with his purpose. In spite of what he says, APT is unlikely "to extend philosophy of technology 'both in scope and method'" by collaborating with CPT (46), and the reason is important. APT and CPT seem to agree in opposing essentialism and decrying the current fragmentation among philosophies of technology, but the agreement is merely apparent. APT wants to make its study of technology into a respectable subfield by systematically relating it to the core fields of analytic philosophy (i.e., metaphysics, epistemology, and the philosophy of mind and language).[3] In other words, it sees itself as a fledgling spin-off from an established flagship program that is deeply rooted in the modern tradition. As such, it opposes transcendentalism and embraces the empirical for the same reasons and with the same understanding of what they are opposing and embracing as did their empiricist/positivist predecessors in rejecting metaphysical speculation and favoring sense experience. So, although we can imagine Smith employing the same words as, say, Maarten Franssen, when the latter talks of APT's abhorrence of system building and its desire that inquiry start from the careful analysis of actual practices; wholly different sources inform what each of them means. Smith's tempered praise for the empirical turn and his critical revival of transcendental inquiry constitute an appropriation of material from earlier Continental philosophers who already saw their works as radical rejoinders to both classical empiricism and modern metaphysics, not as expressing solidarity with those who favor one of them over the latter. Even the earliest CPTs appeal to experience in the spirit of, say, William James' Psychology or Dilthey's historically rich notion of Erlebnis, not Locke or Hume's epistemically thinned idea of perception.

Without seeing this point, it is easy to misunderstand Smith's transcendental revival. According to our familiar stripped-down definition, "Given X, an approach is 'transcendental' where it enquires into a priori conditions for X" (12, 26, 117). But drawing (cautiously) on Catherine Malabou's recent work (12-16),[4] Smith argues that in practice, this definition is virtually useless. The meaning of every term from "given" to "conditions" has always been contested -- a problem in which both APT and advocates of the empirical turn show insufficient interest. Yet conversation is ultimately poisoned by ignoring it -- which is why Smith thinks that reviving the transcendental will necessarily require sustained "reflection on [all the] key terms ('given', 'X', 'inquire', 'a priori', 'conditions')," with the intention of relating them to "a complex, nuanced and evolving sense of the empirical" (12).

Smith treats the idea of turning toward the empirical in this same reflective way. All advocates of this approach have exhibited a shared weakness (107-108), namely, a tendency to define their very idea of turning backwards in terms of the theories they oppose and the sense of the concrete they assume. The result is that CPT has been moving toward ever more fragmenting turns (Smith identifies nine, 113), with some now being made in the name of common sense realism, instrumentalism, phenomenology/postphenomenology, pragmatic naturalism, or even a new form of speculation bent on correcting all the other turns. In each case, its functionally transcendental character goes largely unremarked because it feels familiar and seems obvious (114-18).[5]

In my view, Smith's critical reconsideration of the transcendental in technoscientific life seems to mark out a promising way forward. He rightly stresses that for many Continental philosophers, it has always made perfect sense to think of "conditions for the possibility of . . . " as something experientially grounded rather than theoretically constructed; and the fact that what this means can never be essentially settled because conditions and conditioned are forever varying together is reason to continually address, not permanently ignore, this fact. Put bluntly, living with a transcendental sense of things is existentially unavoidable. Of course, it is always possible to just happily start out from one's received sense of the concrete and the abstract -- as do many analytical philosophers, empirical turners, and Deweyan pragmatists -- remarking only that they are in an anti-theoretical mood. But as recent work shows, this simply means that some received sense continues to silently function, determining how everything is in some obvious, definite, and definitely constraining way (e.g., "Stay with the concrete individual; don't generalize; and consider political, cultural, and moral problems only after first attending to 'the individual's' experiencing, designing, and using technical artifacts").

Smith's alternative is motivated by his experience of the problems that seem to have arisen precisely in CPTs that have taken off from this happy starting point. The empirical turners' initial stress on experiential awareness of particularity was indeed progress. But now the movement must learn how to get out of its own tradition-bound way. In other words, it must continue to listen to what our inheritance makes obvious to us about life's particularities, but with a sharp eye toward tweaking, modifying, or transforming this received sense as current experience itself develops, instead of continuing to allow current experience to be measured by this received sense. Viewed in this way, says Smith, pursuing the transcendental might be characterized as a kind of open-ended method -- that is, an approach that would sustain an experience-based focus on technoscientific life as a field that has not yet been split up into fragments by turnings that are unreflective about their own transcendental limitations, where interdisciplinary study would always be welcomed, and "potentials for dynamic and heterodox forms of philosophical thinking [would always be] at stake" (131).

[1] Hans Achterhuis, American Philosophy of Technology: the Empirical Turn, trans. Robert P. Crease (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001), 5 and 8; cf., Peter-Paul Verbeek, What Things Do: Philosophical reflections on Technology, Agency, and Design, trans. Robert P. Crease (University Park: The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005); and Dominic Smith, Exceptional Technologies, 28. Space limitations prevent me from exploring how this twofold classification does injustice to pragmatist and critical theory-based alternatives. For the former, see Joseph C. Pitt, Doing Philosophy of Technology: Essays in a Pragmatist Spirit (Dordrecht: Springer, 2011); and Larry A. Hickman, Philosophical Tools for Technological Culture: Putting Pragmatism to Work (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001); for the latter, see Andrew Feenberg, Technosystem: The Social Life of Reason (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2017); and "Critical Theory of Technology: An Overview," Tailoring Biotechnologies 1/1 (2005): 47-64.

[2] In Chapter 3, "embodiment conditions" are brought into relief through a discussion of Dreyfus' phenomenological approach to the Internet, contemporary media theory, and so-called "4e" cognitive science.

[3] Maarten Franssen and Stefan Koller, "Philosophy of Technology as a Serious Branch of Philosophy: The Empirical Turn as a Starting Point," in Philosophy of Technology after the Empirical Turn, ed. Martin Franssen, et al. (Dordrecht: Springer, 2016), 31-61, cited 31-32. Franssen is also principle "curator" of the "Philosophy of Technology" entry of the on-line Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy and should be read accordingly. See Maarten Franssen, Gert-Jan Lokhorst, and Ibo van de Poel, "Philosophy of Technology," The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2018 Edition), Edward N. Zalta, ed.

[4] See esp., Avant demain: Épigenèse et rationalité (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 2014).

[5] The essay he cites is Dan Zahavi's "The End of What? Phenomenology vs. Speculative Realism," International Journal of Philosophical Studies 24/3 (2016): 289-309.