Excursions with Kierkegaard: Others, Goods, Death, and Final Faith

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Edward F. Mooney, Excursions with Kierkegaard: Others, Goods, Death, and Final Faith, Bloomsbury, 2013, 211pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441190345.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Hanson, Australian Catholic University


Once upon a time, there was a wildly popular "school" of thought called "existentialism." Ordinary educated persons read works of existential writing and attended plays by existentialist dramatists; existential themes were bandied about in pubs and cafes; even the mass media took note of the way in which existentialist philosophy had broken the boundaries of the academy and been taken up in the streets. Eventually, of course, the badge "existentialist" became exhausted and dismissed, parodied, travestied, and ignored until its favor collapsed. It's hard to say today whether there are any existentialists and, if so, where they are hiding.

Edward F. Mooney is perhaps such an elusive specimen, a spokesman for the authentic self, which is itself a rare and exotic creature. Mooney feels the draw of the philosophically urgent; he is gripped by an impulse to refuse the false, the distracting, the tinseled but shopworn "lifestyles" that the modern world's shabby emporium noisily touts. He is against every hackneyed sentiment, every tawdry evasion, and every unearned consolation.

His book is fit for the educated person still open to wonder and a tonic for the academician whose passion has been dulled by bureaucracy and careerism, who has sold her birthright as a teacher in exchange for being -- to use a Kierkegaardian term of ridicule -- an assistant professor.  And his book is for those who still feel the call to which the existentialist once responded: the whispered summons to traipse the wilderness rather than trace yet again the well-worn path to and from the office. Many of Mooney's metaphors are drawn from the activity of walking and taking in landscapes -- if he isn't a walker himself like his beloved Kierkegaard (or Thoreau, whom he also admires), then he is to be congratulated for his fictive inventiveness, because his imagery strikes the reader as one that is born from life. Indeed, the many meditations in this text positively wriggle with the vitality of the first-hand, like a bucket of eels drawn from a sun-spangled river. Readers expecting a technical account of anything at all will be disappointed. Excursions with Kierkegaard is what its title suggests: more travelogue than treatise. And his companion on the way is lovingly and vividly rendered, a wry Virgil to any Dante who picks up this book. Kierkegaard appears here as by turns sober and wry, difficult and winsome, a poet, a preacher, a prophet, an ironic carnival barker, an astute observer, a friend to the man on the street and a guest of the king, a bon vivant and a Christian, a confidant and critic.

Mooney's excursions are not pigeonholed. A reader could just as easily select one chapter at random and begin there, proceeding to the rest with the same leisure and aimlessness she would giver herself over to while on a country ramble. (The pieces have not been over-polished in order to fit together, which means some anecdotes and examples wear thin by the end, but that assumes one has marched through beginning to end, again, not necessary or perhaps not even advisable.) Two themes stand out: subjectivity and style. With respect to subjectivity, Mooney is keen to dispel the abstract and to bring the language of self back to the soil of its birth:

Kierkegaard defends subjectivity as a first-personal stance from which we meet others and the world and even ourselves -- insofar as we are issues, or marvels, to ourselves. To endorse the truth of subjectivity is to endorse the truth -- the conviction -- that to live is to assume such a first-personal stance. This is not the adolescent mantra that if I believe something then it's true, and that the opinions of others are superfluous. 'Truth is subjectivity' claims a stance we assume as we meet the demands of the day, as we weigh in, now and again, on whatever we say, do, or feel. (ix-x)

Much of what Mooney writes on the subject of the subject reawakens this urgency in the reader, rendering in full relief the texture of life as lived amongst the birds and along the streams, attended by children and lovers, spent in dancing and stumbling and dancing again, even haunted by death.

With respect to Kierkegaardian style, Mooney says

His different genres apply pressure towards recognition of the personal dimensions of experience and sense, and against cultural forces that subvert these dimensions: the imperium of science and technology, of instrumental thinking and careerist strategies, of consumerist hunger, celebrity gossip, entertainment distraction, and a politics of rancor and despair. These familiar forces promising connection with goods in fact disengage us from meaningful life. They fail to answer our need, Kierkegaard holds, and only increase the urgency for subjective attention to richer and deeper goods. (xi)

As becomes clear in the course of these studies, subject and style are linked. Because of the truth of subjectivity in which Kierkegaard is passionately interested and invested, he adapts his means of communication to embrace and convey it, cultivating a set of strategies and genres that are flexible and fluid enough to capture, if only for a moment, the protean and dazzling truth that flits on the edge of consciousness, like a deer started in the woods. As if in imitation of the master, Mooney too practices a form of writerly calling-to-attention, grabbing his reader by the shoulder to say "look there, quick, before it's gone." But neither his content nor form is reconstruction of Kierkegaard but repetition, the same made original again. (Others have assayed such imitations of the Kierkegaardian style with disastrously embarrassing consequences.) Mooney's voice is a unique one in Kierkegaard studies, attentive and intimate, restless and affirmative, perhaps even a peculiarly American voice, the Dane by way of Whitman and Melville and Emerson.

If this affiliation is missing a strand in its heritage, it would be the specifically Christian lineage. Mooney's soliloquies speak deeply about pain and loss and Kierkegaardian resources for coping with suffering without trivializing it, but there is not much vocabulary of sin or salvation. One of the most enriching elements of Mooney's version of Kierkegaard is his attention to the therapeutic work of the Dane's authorship. Caricatures of Kierkegaard portray him as a hopeless melancholic or a mirthless scold or bitter solipsist, but Mooney's Kierkegaard is humane and comforting, and that is a vitally important aspect of the work to keep alive. But the more pastoral Kierkegaard is made to seem, the more precise must be the conceptuality that underwrites the consolation. (Some of Kierkegaard's pseudonyms admittedly do not provide this clarity, but that is part of their mission, to negatively illustrate what results when such rigor is absent; Mooney is for the most part ranging across the authorship.) For example, in "On Self, Others, Goods, and Final Faith," Mooney brackets the obvious theological interpretation of the "grounding power" that establishes the self in The Sickness unto Death, exploring the range of possible meanings that this phrase could allude to besides the God of Christian faith. "This brings to the fore," Mooney claims, "a proto-Christian, experiential substrate on which subsequent theological thinking can be based, and keeps wide open the roughly anthropological frame I have been developing so far" (41). The substrate Mooney explores then is the felt need for grounds beyond the capacity of reason to supply grounds, a more primal conviction that abides where reasons "for" or "against" it would have no meaning.

As always, Mooney's ability to capture the mood of this bewildering but bedrock assurance is lyrical and thereby persuasive, but sometimes one wishes he could be more readily pinned down. It is absolutely correct in my view to open the meaning of "grounding power" in Anti-Climacus to a range of possible meanings, but Anti-Climacus himself allows this while remaining committed to the decisive meaning of the "grounding power" being found in God. The question is what difference does it make for Anti-Climacus to ultimately uphold this affirmation of the divine, an affirmation that indeed is by no means incompatible with other possible meanings but which may indeed establish all those other meanings in their relative position to the final one. In other words, there is a difference between dignifying the legitimacy of the "proto-Christian" and putting it on equal footing with the theological affirmation. I think it likeliest for Kierkegaard that the theological articulation of faith is the very groundless ground he so richly appreciates, and that without this ground the "proto-Christian" experiential substrate remains questionable and ambivalent.

This ambivalence is part of the character of our experience, and Mooney seems to appreciate that. Reason goes weak in the knees when it falls in love because in love the giving of reasons rings hollow: Imagine a marriage proposal prefaced by a list of "Things I Really Like about You." If Mooney is right (and I think he is) that love thrives where reasons leave off, then that is not because our experience just is equivocal and various means and attunements might disclose this but because this is the way love is, and love being what it is renders all experience equivocal. If God is non-metaphorical love par excellence, and I think for Kierkegaard God is, then the aesthetic approach, for all its beauty and splendor, needs the religious to rescue it. Mooney's poetics are not incompatible with the religious -- far from it -- but it might help to be a bit clearer that while for Kierkegaard faith without poetics is inconceivable, poetics without faith is unsustainable.

A sharper degree of precision could also be called for in what is one of the most interesting (to this reader) essays on Fear and Trembling. In "A Faith that Defies Self-Deception," Mooney reverses the usual caricature of faith as hopelessly deluded and argues that Kierkegaardian faith is actually opposed to self-deception (recourse to chapter V of The Concept of Anxiety would further support this intriguing line of argument). That this can be so, he maintains, is because faith is not a "belief" in the sense of affirmation of a proposition but a "stance" in the sense of a posture toward the world (83). (So too self-deception is not a matter of holding an erroneous belief about the state of things but a blameworthy orientation to the self and the world in which the self goes out and comes again to itself.) Mooney admits that "a faithful stance is not beyond critique. It may be ill advised, foolish, infantile or self-destructive," (84) but without an examination of what beliefs might help support faith it is difficult to see how we discriminate between the infantile and the mature, the self-destructive and the life-giving. Mooney's assertion that "Keeping faith in the face of unmistakable desolation is compatible with being quite agnostic about what propositions might (or might not) ground one's steady assurance" (84) might be taking things a bit far, even if we grant that "ground" here be understood more as primal conviction rather than a logical a priori.

Abraham is convinced that God is capable of doing the impossible, even if that means raising his son from the dead. That God does not require him to even go through with the sacrifice also surely provides us at least with a reaffirmation of our belief that the divine one is not pleased by murder (even if it wasn't much help to Abraham). The role of such a belief in the moment that Abraham (or we) must decide is not as grounding as the principle of sufficient reason has been for many a philosopher. But it does have some role to play, as do the beliefs that Abraham bears with him up Mount Moriah about the God he has known, trusted, and loved. And that it is God he believes is commanding in the first place rather than his own perverse will makes a difference too, though in some ways it makes things better for Abraham and in some ways definitely worse. Faith is not a dogma as Mooney says (94), but that's not just because dogma is always a nasty word. Even the most pernicious and unquestioned dogma can't compel faith and would be a weak ground for it to any reflective person. But dogma in the best sense of an accreted body of learning made weighty by time, authority, and the consensus of the many, can be a guide to faith and lead the believer to leave childish things behind. If allergy to dogma alone is a problem, then one must confront the fact that Fear and Trembling's pseudonymous authorial persona Johannes de Silentio at least professes to be a biblical literalist.

One of Mooney's great contributions to reading Fear and Trembling has been to highlight over the course of years the dimensions of maternity and birth that figure faith. It is a disgrace that the feminine characters given pride of place in the text have still not been properly understood in relation to the admittedly dazzling example of Abraham. Mooney takes us a long way toward correcting this oversight, though even he should draw more on the stunning material of Problema III, also still lamentably downplayed in many critical engagements. Critics are often distracted, blinded even, by the violent drama of Moriah (including Levinas), but as Mooney points out, at a certain stage in Fear and Trembling "Terror ceases to be the preferred vehicle of instruction" (85). Mooney is deserving of praise for his sensitivity to the "gentler virtues" that faith instills: freedom from resentment, vulnerability, simple but not simplistic trust. These elements are rarely brought to the fore.

Again it is Mooney's vision that causes us to see Kierkegaard anew, and, as he would admit, no one has an unobstructed vista on the panorama of truth. If he brings us to a new vision, he does so not by force of syllogism but by inviting us to take up a strange and strained perspective. To ask for this fuzziness to be brought to perfect clarity would betray both Mooney's characteristic tenor and the point of what he wants to convey, which is in no small part that for Kierkegaard ambiguity, openness, and subjective shading are endemic to life actually lived rather than frozen in the amber of speculative thought.