Exemplarity and Chosenness: Rosenzweig and Derrida on the Nation of Philosophy

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Dana Hollander, Exemplarity and Chosenness: Rosenzweig and Derrida on the Nation of Philosophy, Stanford University Press, 2008, 267pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780804755214.

Reviewed by Martin Kavka, Florida State University


There are approximately seven books wrapped up in Exemplarity and Chosenness, a book which treats the intellectual debt of Franz Rosenzweig to Hermann Cohen, of Jacques Derrida to Edmund Husserl, of Derrida to Emmanuel Levinas, of Derrida to Rosenzweig, of Continental philosophy to Jewish thought, of Jewish thought to Continental philosophy, and finally the equiprimordiality of life and thought. There will be readers who will feel as if reading this book will itself require teaching a graduate seminar that follows along, chapter by chapter. It is by no means a quick read, and so I err in this review on the side of giving an overly summary account. Still, the central two claims of Hollander's excellent book can be telegraphed quite briefly. First, there is no possibility of thinking the universality of philosophy without thinking the historically and culturally determined particularity of the philosopher who takes that particularity as an example from which universality is derived. In other words, universality is never given as such to thought; it is for this reason that philosophy is bound up with national affirmation (e.g. Greece, Germany, Jewishness). The second move points out that particularity, if it is to be given to thought, can no longer be given as the particularity that it is. For this reason, universalism can, and should be, expressed in terms of an exile from or desertification of the rootedness typically associated with nationalism. We see this move exemplified in Derrida's notion of the "messianic without messianism" in Specters of Marx as well as Rosenzweig's notion of the Jewish people as beyond time in The Star of Redemption. What we are left with is particular communities pointing beyond themselves, invoking the universal as a phantasmatic idea, both regulative and grounding, but all the while invoking it in their own idioms. The universal and particular, the infinite and finite, the nations and the elect nation, require each other to be thought at all.

Hollander opens her argument with a careful examination of the remainders of Hermann Cohen's treatment of Leibnizian infinitesimal calculus (in the 1883 Principle of the Infinitesimal Method and Its History) in both Cohen's later explicitly religious writings as well as Rosenzweig's Star and early essays. Cohen's attentiveness to the infinitesimal as the unintuitable yet necessary basis for calculating the quantity of a whole is re-applied in his later writings to the singular person, who cannot be grasped by a concept and thereby becomes the basis for a relationally constituted notion of the community. Yet the rediscovery of the individual is then mapped onto a political notion of the Jewish remnant as the finite basis for the construction of messianic humanity. Rosenzweig too, in The Star of Redemption, takes up a "metaethical" portrait of the person who is not reduced to a concept, and the Jewish people as the singular bearers of the universal in history. Thus, for both Cohen and Rosenzweig (32), "the Jewish people derives its eternal existence not from the fact of being the contingent bearer of a trait or a message, but from living the chasm between the particularity and the universality of chosenness."

It is this thesis -- that there might be something like a "universality of chosenness" -- that Derrida allows Hollander to defend. Her next chapter engages in a close reading of three early essays of Derrida -- the introduction to Husserl's "The Origin of Geometry," "The Supplement Of Copula," and "Violence and Metaphysics" -- to show that Derrida's work is fundamentally concerned with the process by which one comes to make claims about the universal. Implicitly rejecting the developmental reading of the early Derrida offered by Joshua Kates in Essential History, Hollander shows that Derrida's early concern with the method of ideation in Husserl and protest of accounts of Heidegger as merely ethnocentrist stem from his working through what it means to be conscious of something as an example. Even the most relativist of stances, in which differences between cultures have no normative status, requires the universalism of phenomenological method (50): "I can only determine such differences against the background of general, common notions of experience and cultures, notions that I can acquire only by first 'reducing' what is other about others' experience, and what is mine about my own." Insofar as the relativist views a culture as an example of culture in general, the relativist comes up against the limits of her or his own worldview (and of Weltanschauungsphilosophie in general). Eidetic analysis thus allows for a single example of the universal to become a privileged exemplar; in this manner Europe becomes the ideal origin and telos in the later Husserl, Germany for Heidegger, and Greece for the philosophical view criticized by Levinas.

Hollander closes this chapter by turning to the last lines of "Violence and Metaphysics": "Are we Jews? Are we Greeks? We live in the difference between the Jew and the Greek, which is perhaps the unity of what is called history." Her framework establishes Derrida's questions as inquiring after the process by which certain names become exemplary and govern the interpretation of history as a totality, as well as the process by which the singularity that is the transcendental condition of a name becoming exemplary is occluded by history. History blinds itself to singularities at the same time that its meaning is constituted by singularity (of the Greek or the German, for example). In her third chapter, Hollander deepens her account of the duplicity of the example through treatments of Derrida on proper names, showing that this structure is a necessary one. Derrida's account in his introduction to Husserl's essay on geometry points out that underneath language's deictic function -- its ability to give a name to the singular -- is an annihilation of singularity. Endorsing an argument from Maurice Blanchot's "Literature and the Right to Death," in which Blanchot argues that "the word gives me the being, but it gives it to me deprived of being" (and only as a name), allows Derrida to develop the famous deconstructions of Rousseau and Lévi-Strauss in Of Grammatology, in which the violence of naming is unveiled as the condition of the possibility of communication (89). Similarly, in the 1980 essay "Des Tours de Babel," Derrida takes up the undecidability of the translation of the Hebrew word shemo in the Tower of Babel story in Genesis 11:9 -- does one translate this verse as "Therefore its [the city's] name was called Babel" or "Therefore his [God's] name was called Babel"? -- in the course of an argument that proper names necessarily turn themselves into common nouns in language.

Hollander's fourth chapter takes up the question of what there might be to do with this structure besides describe it. The answer is to verify it, to make it real, through ethical acts. Hollander admirably shows that Derrida's work in the mid-1980s, when he began to offer seminars on the theme of "philosophical nationality," are not the beginning of an ethical turn in Derrida's thought, but rather an ethical application of the insights into exemplarism that Derrida had had from the beginning of his philosophical career. To be true to the ground of the general in the singular is to engage in other-centered ethics à la Levinas and Rosenzweig. The general proceeds from its other, which it ordinarily occludes; this is why philosophy customarily ends up serving nationalistic causes. The categories of the exile and/or emigré(e), however, open up possibilities for envisioning more inclusive cosmopoleis which perform this belonging-together of the singular and the universal that first emerged in Derrida's interpretation of Husserl. The imperative for the nation is thus to maintain its exemplarity by "advancing itself to what it is not," as Derrida writes in The Other Heading; Europe is to make its ground into its telos in a truer fashion than it has before. (Here I wish that Hollander had also incorporated analyses of Derrida's essays on America, e.g. "Declarations of Independence," into her argument. How are we to understand assertions such as "America is deconstruction" in the light of Derrida's intervention into the history of the meaning of nationalism in European philosophy?)

Once Derrida's account of the intimacy between the universal and the particular has been fully fleshed out, Hollander returns to Rosenzweig in her next two chapters. The fifth chapter treats at length the long footnote on Rosenzweig in Derrida's Monolingualism of the Other. There, Hollander is invested, as Derrida was, in showing that Rosenzweig's rhetoric of the Jewish people is not as organicist and racist as it appears on the surface, given Rosenzweig's talk of the Jewish people as a "blood community" in The Star of Redemption. Rosenzweig cannot present the Jewish people as a unique people without talking about blood; but similarly, Rosenzweig cannot present the Jewish people as a unique people without giving an account of Jews as being detached from autochthony by not having a land, by being untranslatable into German or any other "host language," by its messianic existence. Thus, only in positing likeness between Jews and other peoples (by virtue of the language of blood) can any unlikeness come to the surface. Although Hollander is not as explicit about this as she might have been, such a logic would be dictated by the structure of exemplarity that follows from Derrida's reading of Husserl, in which difference can only come to appear against the backdrop of some eidetic universality (in this case, the eidos of peoplehood).

In the sixth chapter, Hollander offers a fascinating reading of messianism and election in Rosenzweig, arguing in effect that the only possible context for thinking the two orders of the universal and the particular together -- as limiting each other -- is one of revelation. "To recognize the human being as the receiver of revelation is thus first of all to recognize the human being as different from itself, as harboring a contradiction within itself, and thus as unredeemed," Hollander writes (175), although it seems that she also means the converse of this claim, namely that to see the human being as harboring a contradiction within itself is first of all to recognize it as the receiver of revelation. The human is determined by ordinary language and history, as well as the transcendent ground of that language/history -- the universal that can only announce itself in a mediated fashion, as the singular exemplar. To be true to this structure is to see oneself as the recipient of revelation, and as one who bears that revelation to the other peoples of the world in one's questing after redemption, that moment when there is no longer a gap between a singular people and the universal. The Jew thus lives as a singular individual in a richly determined context, and lives for the desertification of this context, in redemption.

The similarity between this model of election and Derrida's notion of messianicity is quite striking. A messianism, embedded in a framework of language and culture that makes it singular, in order to be true to itself, seeks its own desertification. Messianism must become a "messianism without messianism," just as Europe is to become itself (universal) by becoming what it is not (open to the stranger and the immigrant).

Yet once Hollander has closed her final chapter with this analogy, having given the most persuasive account of Derrida's relationship with Judaism that exists in the secondary literature on Derrida, as well as the most persuasive account of Rosenzweig's filiation with broadly postmodern themes, one wonders whether it is really possible for nations and peoples to live the imperatives for them that are embedded in transcendental phenomenology. For example, can the Jew be the recipient of concrete revelation at the same time that s/he recognizes it as a revelation of the desertified nature of our telos? Would not such a model require, for example, that Jews cease to observe Passover, which posits the strictest of oppositions between the Jew and the Egyptian, in which neither are on the side of the Derridean desert? Perhaps it would only require observing Passover differently, having a group of people around a dinner table wrestling with the narrative told on that evening. Such a departure from tradition would end up exchanging the synagogue for the seminar room, compounding a merely empirical unredeemedness with a transcendental one. Yet if unredeemedness is insurpassable, then our tele can only be realized through apocalyptic means, no matter how often we will ourselves to become what we are not. How could this not sap our will to choose to advance ourselves?