Existence and Heritage: Hermeneutic Explorations in African and Continental Philosophy

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Tsenay Serequeberhan, Existence and Heritage: Hermeneutic Explorations in African and Continental Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2015, 185pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438457895.

Reviewed by Georgia Warnke, University of California, Riverside


What contribution might African and Continental philosophy make to the future of Africa? In his new and provocative book, Tsenay Serequeberhan notes the incomplete character of the de-colonization of Africa in the 1960's. De-colonization ceded power only to what he calls the "replicant" segment of African society, educated in the West and ready to accept European superiority. Moreover, it ceded power only to indirect rule by the former colonial powers and the United States. Under its replicant ruling class, the nub of what Eqbal Ahmad calls the colonial-postcolonial state in Africa remains violence according to Serequeberhan -- "the imposition of a well-developed bureaucratic superstructure of power over an underdeveloped infrastructure of participation" (113) in which the majority of Africans remain subject to want, insecurity and fear.

In this circumstance, Serequeberhan sees a clear task for African philosophy: "critically engaging and de-structuring on the level of ideas the colonial project, 'the epistemology of imperialism,' that controls us from within" (26). But what can European Continental philosophy offer? Indeed, Existence and Heritage begins by rehearsing the way in which European philosophy helped erect the "epistemology of imperialism." An enlightened reason required mastery of the secrets of the universe, including unknown parts of the earth imagined as the darkest Africa and its people. Moreover, world history was the history of a progressive development in which Europe marked the highest point and other cultures, including African cultures, formed merely its prehistory -- "residues," Serequeberhan says, "of a surpassed humanity to be conquered and studied" (15). Thus Hume thought that no civilized nation could be anything but white; Kant claimed Europe was destined to establish "the law" for humanity as a whole; and even Marx endorsed British colonialism in India as a necessary to the path of civilization and, ultimately, communism.

Serequeberhan thinks much of more recent Continental philosophy is also of little value to deconstructing "the epistemology of imperialism." He notes that despite Levinas's experience of the horrors of World War II, for instance, he not only failed to connect those horrors to a brutality first practiced on the colonized but also, as late as 1991, claimed that "humanity consists of the Bible and the Greeks" (40). Nevertheless, Serequeberhan maintains that other European philosophers, notably Charles Taylor, Vattimo, Derrida and Gadamer move beyond a myopic commitment to the superiority of the West to recognize "the variegated multiplicity of our shared existence" (45). To be sure, this recognition would not have been possible without the spur to their thinking provided by the political struggles of the formerly colonized. Nonetheless, what interests Serequeberhan is their recognition of the need for a dialogue that goes beyond the West's conversation with itself. His book is an effort to engage in and further this fuller conversation. It begins with a re-examination of Kant's essay "Perpetual Peace."

The increased, though still pitiful, diversity of philosophy has not been good for Kant's reputation. Renewed attention to his Anthropology has raised the question of how much its racism infects the rest of his philosophy. Serequeberhan takes up "Perpetual Peace" to suggest that while it offers us an outline for international peace it remains flawed by the same assumptions of European preeminence. Indeed, it is written from the point of view of the same powerful states it seeks to rein in. For Kant, "a powerful and enlightened people" that forms itself into a republic serves by example as the basis of a federation of states. Yet to the extent that this same "powerful and enlightened people" can, given its power, reject a world federation it provides a constant threat to peace. Thus, Serequeberhan claims, "in seeking perpetual peace Kant has stumbled upon the source of perpetual war" (64). The only way out of his "circuitous quagmire" (65), in Serequeberhan's view, is a federation of small states for which international peace is a condition of survival, not simply a question of prestige. As a consequence, he argues, what is needed is a reconfiguration of the United Nations around its weakest members.

Continuing his dialogue with European philosophy, Serequeberhan turns to Gadamer and offers an interpretation of Gadamer's work that should finally put an end to the supposition that it is good only for conservative undertakings. To be sure, Gadamer emphasizes the importance of prejudice and tradition since he thinks these form the basis of the necessarily anticipatory structure of understanding. In trying to make sense out of our world, we do not begin from nowhere but rather always already project meanings based on the assumptions and engagements of those who come before us. On this analysis, as Serequeberhan points out, the Enlightenment's critique of prejudice is a kind of hubris, a denial of its own finitude and immersion in history. Prejudices are not necessarily illegitimate. Instead, they can be justified or unjustified. Moreover, Gadamer's hermeneutics stresses the importance of dialogue with the Other in making this determination. For this reason, Serequeberhan thinks that claims Gadamer made in interviews towards the end of his life are emblematic of his hermeneutics as a whole. In one interview he contrasts the tendency toward domination stemming from Western science and technology with the "relaxed conversation of a Chinese wise person with his disciples." In another he points to the importance of being open and receptive to "what has come down to us from world cultures, not just the European!" Given our historical and finite existence, our only hope of coming to recognize and evaluate our prejudices is through dialogue with others in what Serequeberhan calls a "radical openness." In this, he thinks Gadamer mirrors Aimé Césaire: dialogue grounded in an acknowledgement of finitude is what Césaire refers to as "a universal rich with all that is particular, rich with all the particulars, the deepening and coexistence of all the particulars" (96).

In another chapter, Serequeberhan takes up the aspects of Marx and Heidegger -- specifically their concern with what Césaire call chosification -- that Serequeberhan thinks are relevant to Africa's post-colonial situation. Here he focuses on the similarities between Marx's conception of alienation and Heidegger's account of das Man and, moreover, between the economic process that Marx describes in which humans are reduced to things and the everyday process in the modern world that Heidegger describes in which the being of human existence is reduced to the present-at-hand. Serequeberhan attributes insight into these similarities to Kostas Axelos, although others have obviously explored them as well. In Serequeberhan's view, Marx and Heidegger also supplement each other: Marx fails to uncover the ontological presuppositions of alienation while Heidegger fails to "give us an inkling as to how we are to 'prepare . . . a transformed abode of man in the world'" (110). Yet the fundamental exigency for post-colonial Africa is just this: given the gap between its "deplorable actuality" and "the promise of independence" (116), how does it transform its abode?

In his conclusion, Serequeberhan asks us to recall that long before Lyotard instructed us to beware of grand narratives, Césaire claimed the right for the formerly colonized to write themselves into history. For Serequeberhan, this history ought not be a simple erasure of white history, but a fuller, richer history, able to leave behind passé conceptions, open to the Other and remembering with Vattimo that "it is always possible to rethink history, pulling out [as needed] new things and old things" (118). "Since the fifteenth century," Serequeberhan writes, "we have made ourselves into vaqueros and their benumbed domesticated brutes -- victimizers and victims -- straitjacketed into and by the history of imperious Europe. We need now to bypass this residual dead-past, which clings to us like swamp mud" (121-2).

One might take this claim as a promissory note. Serequeberhan takes from his interpretation of Gadamer, refracted through Vattimo, the claim that history and tradition are rich resources not as some pure past to which Africans must return unsullied by later events. Rather, Africans are hybrids of their own history and the history imposed upon them; this is the effective-history Serequeberhan wants them to take up and move forward. Doing so requires sifting through and rethinking, pulling out threads and leaving others aside, as Vattimo suggests and as Serequeberhan's own engagement with Continental figures reflects. Despite Serequeberhan's appeal to African philosophy, it remains less explored here. Césaire is a constant presence and beacon but his views are not probed in depth and the same holds for other African figures with whom Serequeberhan engages such as Chinua Achebe. If we are to bypass the residual dead-past in the hermeneutically conscious way that Serequeberhan wants us to, however, we will all need their help.