Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience

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Carl F. Craver, Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience, Oxford University Press, 2007, 308pp., $49.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780199299317.

Reviewed by Valerie Gray Hardcastle, University of Cincinnati


Neuroscience has moved front and center in the public scientific consciousness.  We all enjoy the color MRI pictures regularly published in news magazines.  Newspapers regularly feature the latest in brain research.  And pop media commentators interview neuroscientists with greater and greater frequency.  Given how much attention has been paid to neuroscience, it is a little surprising how slow philosophy of science has been in exploring the philosophical issues involved in explaining the brain and using the brain to explain behavior.  There have been pockets of activity, I would say, but few systematic accounts that explore the field of neuroscience as a whole.  Carl Craver's book Explaining the Brain: Mechanisms and the Mosaic Unity of Neuroscience represents this new direction, and an excellent addition to a burgeoning field it is.

Craver seeks to answer the question: what is necessary for a good explanation in neuroscience?  The short answer he defends is that good explanations in neuroscience are those that describe mechanisms.  This answer is both descriptive and normative.  Our current good explanations are those that articulate mechanisms.  And good explanations should explicate mechanisms.  Part of the reason why we need mechanisms in neuroscientific explanations is that most of them are given with an eye toward controlling the brain in some fashion, and to gain the sort of control envisioned, one needs to control the relevant causal mechanisms.

To support his answer, Craver turns to actual explanations in neuroscience and focuses on lots of neuroscientific detail.  This strategy in philosophy of science is both crucial and rarely used.  The breadth and depth of Craver's discussions of the history of the Hodgkin-Huxley model of action potentials and the connection between LTP and memory are truly impressive.  At the same time, these could make the book a difficult read for those unused to poring over the minutiae of cell biology.

In addition to describing mechanisms, good explanations in neuroscience cross multiple levels of organization in the brain or body and integrate data across multiple fields or experimental protocols.  To be multi-level is a different beast than what philosophers of science normally talk about when they talk about moving among various levels of organization in the physical world.  Philosophers normally focus on reduction, how the various levels of description fit together such that the lowest level contains the casual "juice" that runs the entire complex system.  In contrast, a multi-level explanation does not need to have each level of description completely spelled out.  As Craver puts it, neuroscientific explanations are "more local and fragmentary than that" (p. 9).  We do not need a complete theory of each entity or process at each level to be able to understand what each entity or process contributes to the final outcome.

Because neuroscientific explanations are multi-level, it follows almost trivially that they integrate across fields.  Neuroscience as a discipline is huge; at last count, the Society of Neuroscience had over 40,000 members, with specializations ranging from anatomy to biophysics to behavioral psychology to psychiatry, each with an eye towards understanding the nervous system.  It is not surprising that each has something to contribute in explanations of complex nervous phenomena.

Craver wants to differentiate his perspective from dedicated metaphysicians who argue against so-called downward causation.  Metaphysicians concern themselves with the absolute fabric of the universe and, by and large, they argue that higher-level phenomena cannot control, constrain, or influence lower-level phenomena.  Causality only works in one direction: upward.  In contrast, Craver holds that the pragmatics of explanations sometimes requires that we stop our analyses at the higher levels.  While the true causal muscle might ultimately turn out to be at the lower levels, descriptions of what is happening at the higher levels is the most useful in solving our problems of prediction and control.  To put it in his language, Craver argues that mechanisms are different from realizations.  Hence, a higher-level mechanistic causal interaction might have lower level realizations.  Where the real causal power lies, however, is beyond the scope of his investigation.  It is enough to know that successful explanations often rely on the higher-level mechanisms and adding in descriptions of the lower-level realizers would clutter the explanation with unnecessary detail.

Here we can detect a tension in Craver's work between the pragmatics of explanation pushing towards a more anti-realist view of science -- a good explanation is one that works well -- and his own emphasis on causal mechanisms, which pushes towards a reductionistic realism.  In order to have a notion of mechanism with teeth, we have to assume that the identified mechanisms are actually responsible for the effects we are trying to explain and are not just convenient shorthand descriptors for something else.  But if we assume this, then we cannot maintain that we sometimes stop our explanations at levels higher than the actual causal mechanisms because it is easier for us to understand.  I think if Craver wants to keep his causal mechanisms as crucial in explanations because that is what controls the outcomes, then he cannot differentiate between mechanisms and realizations.

Nevertheless, Craver wants to use the distinction between mechanism and realization to argue against a reductive account of neuroscience.  Different theories and explanations will perhaps not knit themselves together into reductive consummation but instead we would find a "mosaic" of theories, each of which constrains the mechanisms hypothesized in others but none need reduce tightly to another.  Craver sees a mature neuroscience not requiring a "stepwise reduction of higher-level theories to successively lower level, and ultimately fundamental, theories" (p. 228), but only a looser integration of theories with one another.  This integration produces more robust explanations, "explanations that can withstand scrutiny from independent perspectives and with independent techniques" (p. 269).  With different fields using different means to access relevant data, they independently triangulate on the appropriate causal mechanisms.  With multiple lines of support, these mechanisms provide for explanations in which we can have maximal confidence.

I agree there is much strength in having different research techniques point to the same answer.  That does provide the best sort of support for our theories.  While I am less sanguine that one can use these sorts of considerations to divorce pragmatics from metaphysics, if we ignore the question of how our explanatory needs fit with our ontological commitments, we can see that there is much good about Craver's position.

Explaining the Brain is timely, well-written, and meticulously argued.  While I am not convinced that all of Craver's positions are ultimately cogent, I highly recommend this text to anyone with any interest in how theories in neuroscience are constructed.  It should be of interest to all philosophers of science and any neuroscientists with a philosophical bent.  As one of the first in-depth treatments of theory-construction in neuroscience, Craver's book sets the bar high.  It will be difficult indeed to surpass this work in the near future.