Explaining the Reasons We Share: Explanation and Expression in Ethics, Volume 1

Placeholder book cover

Mark Schroeder, Explaining the Reasons We Share: Explanation and Expression in Ethics, Volume 1, Oxford University Press, 2014, 249pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198713807.

Reviewed by Jonas Olson, Stockholm University


If you are reading this review you may well know that Mark Schroeder is an extraordinarily prolific writer. During the last decade, his work in metaethics and adjacent areas has been highly influential. This volume, the first of two, comprises eleven papers, one not published before, on interrelated topics like reasons, supervenience, and reduction. The papers are characteristically rich in ideas and detail. There is also an introductory chapter in which Schroeder gives a very helpful overview of his philosophical project, explaining how the individual papers hang together.

The volume is divided into four parts. The motivation behind this division seemed unclear to me, and there are no thematic headings, so I shall ignore it. In what follows I will summarize, in order, each paper fairly quickly and offer some, mostly brief, critical remarks. First of all, however, I will consider what Schroeder calls the 'Standard Model' of normative explanation, which provides a background to many of the papers and which is identified as the volume's 'primary stalking horse' (3).

By 'normative explanation,' Schroeder does not have in mind explanations of non-normative facts by appeal to normative facts as explanans, but explanations of normative facts as explananda (2). According to the Standard Model, normative explanations are 'subsumptive in nature, subsuming specific obligations in context to more general obligations, by appeal to specific features of the agent's circumstances' (3).

The Standard Model Theory (SMT) holds that all normative explanations, i.e., explanations of why someone ought to do something, or has an obligation to do something, etc., follow the Standard Model (28). For example, a utilitarian who accepts SMT might hold that the explanation of an agent's specific obligation to refrain from eating meat is that the agent's circumstances are such that she can refrain from eating meat, and were she to do so, she would bring about more happiness than if she were to eat meat, and that she is under a general obligation to bring about as much happiness as she can.

SMT applies not only to oughts and obligations, but also to goodness, in which case explanations terminate in claims about intrinsic goodness (2). Schroeder maintains that many philosophers tacitly accept SMT and that it has implications for a wide variety of issues in normative ethics and metaethics. But he also holds that SMT is false. On the alternative view he favours, normative explanations terminate in constitutive explanations of what it is for it to be the case that some agent ought, or has an obligation, to do something, or of what it is for something to be good, etc. (2-3). Schroeder holds that in order for such a view to be fully explanatory, it has to be reductive, i.e., it has to offer 'analyses of the basic normative concepts or properties in non-normative terms' (7).

A recurring theme in the volume is that 'if we restrict ourselves, in doing explanatory normative theorizing, to subsumptive explanations . . . then we leave too much unexplained' (2); 'explanatory moral theorizing can aspire to perfect generality only if we reject the Standard Model' (7). It is not entirely clear to me whether Schroeder takes explanatory normative (or moral) theorizing to be a part of normative or metaethical inquiry. If we restrict ourselves to subsumptive explanations of the kind proposed by SMT, do we really leave too much unexplained in normative ethics? If we arrive at a satisfactory theory of what is right and wrong, and of what makes actions right and wrong, haven't we been successful enough in normative ethics? We might of course also want to know what it is for an action to be right, or wrong, and what it is for something to make an action right, or wrong, but that would seem to be a question in metaethics, rather than in normative ethics.

I anticipate Schroeder's response to be that these qualms are based on too sharp a division between normative ethics and metaethics, and that one thing that the falsity of SMT indicates is that normative ethics and metaethics are continuous disciplines, not as sharply separable as is sometimes thought (7). Although this suggestion is to be found at several places, I struggled to find an explicit defence of it.

Neither was it clear to me that SMT and reductive accounts are rival theories. Schroeder appears to stipulate that SMT is incompatible with reductive accounts (3, 28), but the motivation for this stipulation is not clear. Why couldn't one accept some version of SMT as an explanation of why someone ought to do something, or has an obligation to do something, or why something is good, and then go on to accept some reductive account of what it is for it to be the case the someone ought to do something, or has an obligation to do something, or that something is good? It might be that many philosophers who have tacitly accepted SMT have also been non-reductivists in metaethics, but one wonders how tight the connection between SMT and non-reductivism really is.

The first paper, 'Cudworth and Normative Explanations,' contains a detailed and informative -- and occasionally a bit wordy -- exposition of the Standard Model and theories that incorporate it. It focuses especially on Ralph Cudworth's 'Cudworthy' argument against theological voluntarism. The latter view says that for any person X and action-type A, if X ought to do A, this is because God has commanded X to do A (20). Cudworth's objection, which has been echoed by modern philosophers, is in brief that theological voluntarism cannot explain why anyone ought to comply with God's commands. The obligation to comply with God's commands must be a basic or unexplained obligation. Schroeder argues that what figures in the background here is SMT, and that the voluntarist can respond to Cudworth by insisting that for God to have commanded X to do A is just what it is for it to be the case that X ought to do A (32). However, Schroeder also argues that Cudworth is aware of this possible voluntarist rejoinder, and that he has another argument up his sleeve to meet it. This other argument is a version of the Open Question argument that later came to be associated with G. E. Moore (36). Schroeder draws several interesting lessons from this discussion. One is that the Cudworthy argument against reductive views in metaethics has to rely on something like the Open Question argument.

The second paper, 'Reasons and Agent-Neutrality,' defends the view that the reason relation has three places (for reason, agent, and action), rather than merely two (for reason and action). The third, 'The Humean Theory of Reasons,' offers a methodological argument for the view that all reasons reduce to facts about agents' psychologies, in particular their desires, and about what courses of behaviour would bring about satisfaction of these desires.

The argument, which is familiar to readers of Schroeder's Slaves of the Passions (2007), is based on the case of Ronnie, who likes dancing, and Bradley, who dislikes dancing. Intuitively, the fact that there will be dancing at tonight's party is a reason for Ronnie to go there, but not so for Bradley. What explains this difference? Answer: Facts about Ronnie's and Bradley's respective psychologies; in particular that the former desires to dance while the latter desires not to. Schroeder argues that if we accept that all reasons are at bottom to be explained in the same kind of way, we have a 'presumptive motivation' for a Broad Humean Theory of Reasons (76). But that is not obvious. For one might well want to argue that the fact that there will be dancing at tonight's party is a reason for Ronnie to go there because he will enjoy dancing, while dancing. If so, Ronnie's reason is not explained in terms of a feature of his psychology at the time of choice or decision, but at the time of acting (in this case, dancing). It might even be that the fact there will be dancing at the party is a reason for Bradley, who at the time of decision or choice desires not to dance, to go to the party, because once at the party he will (would) enjoy dancing. Schroeder might want to consider this kind of theory as an instance the Broad Humean Theory of Reasons, but that would seem to require an unusually broad construal of the theory.

'What Matters about Metaethics?,' is the most polemical and also the most entertaining piece in the volume. Schroeder challenges Derek Parfit's striking claim that if Parfit's metaethical view, a brand of non-reductive realism, is not true, Parfits life has been wasted, along with the lives of some other philosophers. Schroeder concedes that it seems 'presumptuous' to challenge a person's views about when and why that person's life has been, or would have been, wasted. But he takes it to be no more presumptuous than some of the claims Parfit makes in the course of the metaethical discussion in On What Matters (2011), e.g., that Schroeder does not believe his (Schroeder's) own view. While I do not share Schroeder's enthusiasm for reductivism in metaethics, I am persuaded by his insistence that reductive views can allow that it is true that a person who is the author of such a ground-breaking and influential work as Reasons and Persons has not had a wasted life.

In 'Supervenience Arguments Under Relaxed Assumptions' the relaxed assumptions in question are ones that are weaker than those of the system of modal logic known as S5. The focus is in particular on Ralph Wedgwood's recent attempt to defend non-reductive normative realism by accepting supervenience and rejecting S5 (Wedgwood 2007). The paper, which is co-written with Johannes Schmitt, stands out as the densest and most demanding piece in the volume, but it is also illuminating. The authors do a good job in explaining highly technical issues, along with the costs of unintuitiveness that Wedgwood's view has to bear.

The sixth paper, 'The Price of Supervenience,' also deals with supervenience and non-reductive normative realism. It explores the possibilities of finding a version of moral non-reductivism that respects both supervenience and Hume's Dictum. The latter says roughly that there are no necessary relations between distinct existences. Schroeder relates this discussion in very fruitful and interesting ways both to the work of the unjustly neglected eighteenth century rationalist Richard Price, and to more recent work of T. M. Scanlon (2014). Schroeder proposes that the non-reductivist take fundamental moral truths, i.e., truths about which action types have the properties of being intrinsically good, or intrinsically wrong, or the like, to be necessary (139-42). However, having done his best on non-reductivism's behalf, Schroeder is in the end not entirely optimistic about its ability to satisfy both desiderata (143-44).

In fact, one wonders whether the project wasn't doomed to fail already at the outset. For if the non-reductivist holds that fundamental moral truths are necessary, they seem to be committed to affirming that moral properties are necessarily related to natural properties. But since moral non-reductivism is the view that moral and natural properties are distinct existences, the non-reductivist violates Hume's Dictum. For example, a non-reductivist utilitarian who holds that the action type of failing to maximize happiness has the property of being wrong, and who follows Schroeder's proposal, will be committed to holding that, necessarily, any action token that has the natural property of being a failure to maximize happiness has the distinct, moral property of being wrong. Towards the end of the paper, Schroeder comes close to saying this, but he does not quite say it (142).

'The Scope of Instrumental Reason' and 'Means-End Coherence, Stringency, and Subjective Reasons,' deal with the topic of instrumental rationality, challenging 'wide-scope' accounts and exploring what a plausible account of instrumental rationality should look like. They are less tightly connected to the preceding six papers than to the final three. Schroeder notes in the introduction that they do not represent his current views very well (11).

The final three papers seem more well-tuned to his current thinking. 'The Hypothetical Imperative?' is a very interesting critique of readings of Kant, according to which his view of hypothetical imperatives is a wide-scope account, rather than a narrow-scope account (what Schroeder in this paper calls the 'consequent scope' account). Schroeder argues, to my mind convincingly, that wide-scope readings fail to make sense of Kant's claim that it is categorical imperatives that require philosophical explanations, while hypothetical imperatives are comparatively unproblematic because they are analytic. 'Hypothetical Imperatives, Scope, and Jurisdiction,' revisits and expands on the same theme. Here Schroeder agrees with Kant that categorical imperatives are more puzzling than hypothetical imperatives. For it is puzzling how any law can have jurisdiction over all rational agents, but it is less puzzling how a rational agent can have jurisdiction over herself.

The final paper, 'Scope for Rational Autonomy,' is a further contribution to the debate between wide and narrow scope accounts of instrumental rationality. Here Schroeder responds to some of John Broome's recent arguments in favour of a wide scope account. In this paper, as in the preceding one, Schroeder argues that it is not very puzzling how a rational agent can have and exercise jurisdiction, or authority, over herself, for to do so is simply to commit oneself. What it is to commit oneself is not up to an individual rational agent, but what to commit oneself to is.

Reading through this volume requires patience and focus, but it is a rewarding effort. The papers are characterised by philosophical ingenuity and meticulousness. Indeed, the meticulousness sometimes approaches wordiness, which occasionally may cause the reader, if not the author, to lose sight of the forest for all the trees. This tendency is apparent in papers 1 and 6, for example, in which Schroeder could have cut quicker to the chase. But that is not a major complaint. I learned a great deal from engaging with Schroeder's papers, and I urge any serious metaethicist, who has not done so already, to do so as well.


Thanks to Krister Bykvist and Frans Svensson for reading and commenting on an earlier version of this review.


Parfit, D. 2011. On What Matters, volume 2. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Scanlon, T. M. 2014. Being Realistic about Reasons. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schroeder, M. 2007. Slaves of the Passions. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Wedgwood, R. 2007. The Nature of Normativity. Oxford: Oxford University Press.