Exploitation and Developing Countries: The Ethics of Clinical Research

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Jennifer S. Hawkins and Ezekiel J. Emanuel (eds.), Exploitation and Developing Countries: The Ethics of Clinical Research, Princeton University Press, 2008, 327pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691126760.

Reviewed by David DeGrazia, George Washington University


Exploitation and Developing Countries, edited by Jennifer Hawkins and Ezekiel Emanuel, is an outstanding contribution to the literatures on exploitation and on the ethics of clinical trials in developing countries. The book comprises an introduction and nine chapters with contributions from six distinguished authors in addition to the editors. For philosophers, it provides a model of engagement with important empirical details; for clinicians and bioethicists it is a paragon of conceptual clarity and argumentative rigor. Although hardly free of difficulties, the volume demonstrates the power that philosophical bioethics can wield, including its capacity to make progress on thorny, real-world moral problems.

Entitled "Why Exploitation?" the introduction helpfully sets up the discussions to follow. Particularly useful is the background provided on the short-course AZT trials in several African countries and Thailand, and on the ethical issues provoked by these studies: What is the appropriate standard of care? What should be required in terms of informed consent? Must the fruits of successful research be reasonably available, post-trial, to the populations from which subjects were drawn? What would count as fair compensation? Common to the moral concerns, the editors observe, is the theme of exploitation -- hence the book's focus on this concept.

Chapter 1, by Jennifer Hawkins, provides an overview of the ethics of clinical research and an introduction to the concept of exploitation. The discussion of clinical research ethics, which is especially thorough and informative, discusses informed consent, randomized clinical trials (with special emphasis on the differences between placebo-controlled and active-controlled trials), standard of care, and clinical equipoise. The brief introduction to the concept of exploitation distinguishes Marxist conceptions, which the book's authors uniformly reject, and contemporary non-Marxist conceptions. By the end of this chapter, it becomes clear that the theory of exploitation developed by Alan Wertheimer (one of the authors) exerts terrific influence throughout the volume. As Hawkins points out, moreover, all the authors converge on the following propositions: (1) A's exploitation of B involves A's taking advantage of B in some morally inappropriate way (with theorists filling in details differently), (2) not all exploitation is involuntary on the part of the person exploited, (3) exploitation need not be harmful, and (4) it doesn't follow from the fact that an act or practice is exploitative that it ought to be prohibited. Because instances of exploitation can be consensual and harmless, much of the theoretical action comes with attempts to specify the "morally inappropriate way" in which exploitation involves someone's taking advantage of another individual.

Chapter 2 presents two cases studies: the Havrix and Surfaxin trials, neither of which is as well known as the frequently discussed short-course AZT trials. The Havrix study, sponsored by the U.S. army, SmithKline Beechum, and the Thai Ministry of Public Health, involved testing a hepatitis A vaccine against a hepatitis B vaccine control on 40,000 Thai children ranging in age from one to sixteen. The Surfaxin study, sponsored by Discovery Labs, had planned (before being cancelled) to test a new drug for the treatment of respiratory distress syndrome in premature infants against a placebo -- despite the existence of several effective treatments for the disease -- on infants in Bolivia. The detailed presentation of the studies furnishes a common factual backdrop for the authors, who offer their distinctive moral commentaries. Because so much ink has been spilled on the short-course AZT trials, it was an excellent editorial decision to turn to Havrix and Surfaxin, which are equally fertile and fresher ground for ethical exploration.

In the pivotal Chapter 3, a model of lucid, constructive analytical philosophy, Alan Wertheimer explores the conceptual contours of exploitation, its moral significance, and its relevance to clinical trials. His discussion provides much of the common ground -- some of which is expressed in the four propositions identified in Hawkins' Introduction -- among the discussions that follow while heading off many common misconceptions about exploitation (e.g., regarding its relationship to vulnerability). Taking up consensual, mutually advantageous exploitation, Wertheimer sensitively explores various possible grounds for interfering with such transactions despite their voluntary nature and lack of harm. The most promising grounds, he finds, are the "strategic" and "prophylactic" arguments (think union restrictions and an exceptionless rule prohibiting sex between therapist and patient, respectively). Ultimately, he endorses a presumption in favor of a Principle of Permissible Exploitation (PPE) and clinical trials that meet its conditions despite being unfair, unjust, or exploitative. The chapter also includes a valuable discussion of the "reasonable availability" standard regarding post-trial benefits and concludes with a plea for careful analysis and against heavy polemics.

Despite my admiration for this chapter, I would be remiss if I did not register a few concerns. First, I did not find fully persuasive the arguments for even a presumption in favor of PPE. Here Wertheimer leans a little too much, from my perspective, in a libertarian direction. (Naturally, this note about my reactions does not constitute an argument.)

Second, the presentation of the "exploitation argument" is uncharacteristically sloppy:

(1) If a practice is exploitative, it should not be permitted.

(2) Placebo-controlled trials (PCTs) such as the Surfaxin trial are exploitative.

(3) Therefore, PCTs should not be permitted. (64)

The conclusion (3) refers to PCTs in general. But (2), to be plausible, must be more restrictive, as suggested by "such as the Surfaxin trial" (i.e., a certain type of PCT). The scope inconsistency is confusing.

Third, I am not persuaded that for A to exploit B, A must benefit (69). That is, it seems to me that exploitation requires an attempt to take unfair advantage, not necessarily the (actual) taking of unfair advantage. If a university recruits a nearly illiterate athlete with the intention of strengthening the basketball team and attracting more alumni donations, and then does little to educate him or help him otherwise, I believe the school has exploited the student even if he brings no actual benefit to the university. We could, of course, insist with Wertheimer that such cases involve only attempted exploitation. But then many of the moral claims we wish to advance would have to make awkward reference to "exploitation and/or attempted exploitation." In the present case, it is the school's attempt to take advantage of the student without benefitting him in some fair way that is wrongful.

Chapter 4, by Thomas Pogge, is exceptionally original and insightful. Pogge notes a tension within morality -- involving "compliance incentives" and "reward incentives" -- leading to a kind of counter-productivity. Unlike Wertheimer and like-minded thinkers, Pogge identifies drug companies themselves as partly responsible for creating the conditions of global inequity and injustice. In the end, he proposes several strategies for alleviating the counter-productivity inherent in morality in the context of clinical trials in developing countries.

In Chapter 5, Richard Arneson offers a nuanced discussion of how a type of act-consequentialism -- similar to act-utilitarianism but with a prioritarian commitment to the worse off in evaluating consequences -- should approach issues of exploitation and multinational clinical research. He argues that the concept of exploitation provides a useful heuristic for moral thinking but cannot serve as the basis for a stand-alone moral norm. That is because any such norm will bracket consequences for persons other than those involved in a transaction in determining whether it involves exploitation (as in "A's exploitation of B involves A's taking advantage of B is some morally inappropriate way"). Ultimately, Arneson suggests that we "seek to put in place regimes of regulation that will alter the terms of trade in favor of poor people in poor countries without tilting so far that the losses stemming from reduction in mutually beneficial cooperation due to the regulation outweighs the gains arising to people from the altered terms of trade" (171).

Chapter 6, by Andrew Siegel, is a sophisticated Kantian exploration of exploitation in the context of the clinical trials under discussion. Siegel argues through a Kantian framework that "A exploits B when A secures a benefit from B by acting toward B on a maxim that (1) subverts the conditions of B's rational agency, (2) fails to acknowledge needs that are essential to B qua rational agent, or (3) demeans or degrades B despite the fact that preservation of B's agency is not at issue" (181). He further contends that when A exploits B by violating a duty of beneficence, A is complicit in the situation from which she gains. In an interesting discussion, he suggests that the issue of placebo controls is not really about optimal care or minimizing risk, as is often thought. Rather, it concerns obligatory beneficence: Sponsors of clinical trials exploit when they try to benefit from conditions that they have an obligation to improve. But those of us who would condemn such exploitation, he cautions, should not forget that we share this obligation of beneficence.

Chapter 7, by Alisa Carse and Margaret Little, is full of moral and conceptual insight. The authors contend that even "a voluntary transaction counts as exploitative if A takes advantage of a deep vulnerability of B's and this vulnerability is one that, given A's normative role, A has special moral reason not to press" (47 -- note that, finding the authors' discussion somewhat difficult to follow, I here rely on Hawkins' pithy formulation). For example, a graduate student may be happy to weed his dissertation mentor's garden while she is away, but, given his great dependence on her good will, she should not ask him this favor. Carse and Little argue persuasively that clinical research is a normative enterprise whose norms differ from those appropriate to the marketplace and those of medical care. They examine the standard of care issue and reasonable availability standard through the lens of their framework. In the end, they judge the proposed Surfaxin trial indefensible for the ways in which it would prey on the vulnerability of the Bolivian parents of the sick infants who would be enrolled; the Havrix trial, they suggest, may or may not be defensible depending on unknown details of several contextual factors.

In Chapter 8, Jennifer Hawkins explores whether a certain type of placebo case (defined by five conditions (247)) involves exploitation. After undermining the medical model of researcher obligations -- that researchers have the same obligations to subjects that doctors have to their patients (which, as we just saw, Carse and Little also reject) -- Hawkins argues that we should think about the cases in question in terms of the Good Samaritan obligations that researchers (and the rest of us) have. When these obligations are defeated by certain conditions -- a morally weighty research aim, placebo controls necessary to obtain the information sought, the community from which subjects are drawn is likely to benefit -- then the subjects are not exploited. When these obligations are not defeated, such placebo cases "flout the obligation to perform easy rescues" (278) and exploit the subjects. Such exploitation must be avoided, she concludes, to promote the public trust and support that are vital to the research enterprise. On the whole, I found the chapter's argumentation to be compelling and the prose to be a model of clarity and explicitness (although Hawkins overuses italics, for my taste).

The final chapter was written by Ezekiel Emanuel and "Participants of the 2001 Conference on Ethical Aspects of Research in Developing Countries." The chapter challenges the consensus view that "reasonable availability" is necessary to avoid exploitation in clinical trials in developing countries before defending an alternative, "fair benefits" framework. The authors open with a very helpful survey of current views regarding the reasonable availability requirement, comparing various interpretations of how strong a commitment must be made to provide research benefits, who bears responsibility for ensuring reasonable availability, and who is to receive post-trial benefits. After analyzing (once again!) the nature of exploitation, the authors reveal problems with the consensus view. "The fundamental problem with reasonable availability," they write, "is that it guarantees a type of benefit -- the proven intervention -- but not a fair level of benefits and therefore does not necessarily prevent exploitation" (295). Next, the fair benefits framework is characterized as encompassing three principles -- fair benefits, collaborative partnership, and transparency -- which are specified, rather usefully, into fourteen benchmarks. I found the argumentative thrust of this chapter quite compelling. Indeed, it provides some of what I have in mind in saying, as I do above, that the book demonstrates the potential of philosophical bioethics to make progress on difficult and important moral problems.

At the same time, the discussion strikes me as not very compelling in places. For example, in discussing the Kantian conception of exploitation (291-92), the authors pick on a rather weak analysis published in 1985 -- before much high-quality work on exploitation, by Wertheimer and others, appeared. Why not cite this volume's own Kantian analysis by Siegel (181)? Then there would be no reason to suggest that a Kantian must believe, implausibly, that all exploitation is harmful (292). Later, in discussing difficulties of the reasonable availability requirement, the authors claim that it "connotes that the population cannot make its own, autonomous decisions about what benefits are worth the risks of a research trial" (297). But the strongly anti-paternalistic tone of the paragraph in which the sentence appears is jarring given earlier chapters' sensitive discussions of vulnerability in relation to exploitation. At the very least, some mention of the latter theme would have been appropriate to improve cohesion between this discussion and earlier ones.

Following the final chapter, of course, is the index. I believe it is poorly organized. Most importantly, it is too inclusive of subjects. For example, even though the entire book concerns ethics, there is an entry for ethics and another for morals -- each with almost a full column of subentries. I was surprised to find as well an entry for Bioethics -- until I found that, on the single page listed, the journal with that name was mentioned. Honestly, would anyone check an index to see whether a particular journal is mentioned? There is also an entry for exploitation despite the fact that the whole book addresses this topic. Predictably, the entry is colossal, running more than 1½ columns. Further, and quite oddly, one finds entries like Arneson, Richard J., 142-74. It turns out that these 33 pages are not about the author; they are by him. There are similar entries for other authors in the volume. But it's the job of the table of contents, not the index, to inform the reader about what pages are written by whom.

The concerns voiced towards the end of this review should not cause the reader to forget the great compliments that I have sincerely paid to Exploitation and Developing Countries. Again, it is an outstanding contribution to philosophy and bioethics. I have learned much from the book.