Exploring the Illusion of Free Will and Moral Responsibility

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Gregg D. Caruso (ed.), Exploring the Illusion of Free Will and Moral Responsibility, Lexington Books, 2013, 324pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739177310.

Reviewed by Brian Robinson, Grand Valley State University


Gregg Caruso has brought together a distinguished collection of contributors to lead the reader through an investigation of the arguments for, implications of, and potential responses to the rise of skepticism about free will. Free will skepticism, which Caruso tells us has become increasingly popular in recent decades, questions the existence of free will without necessarily adopting the truth of causal determinism. There are, as the authors of the sixteen chapters point out, a wide range of philosophical and scientific reasons for regarding free will as an illusion. As the title suggests though, free will is only half of the illusion. To doubt the existence of free will is typically to doubt the existence of moral responsibility. Hence, they are tied together as one collective illusion.

The book is divided into two sections. The first eleven chapters that form Part I are philosophical arguments for skepticism about free will and moral responsibility. The remaining five chapters focus on recent scientific research concerning free will and moral responsibility, including the related topics of consciousness, intentionality, and agency. While this division is natural and generally helpful, it could obscure the nature of the chapters in each section. Some of the chapters in Part I discuss empirical findings. Part II, meanwhile, is not by any means bereft of philosophical substance. Within Part I, several of the chapters are grouped with others that focus on related topics. Manuel Vargas (chapter 10), for instance, re-iterates his call for the possibility and necessity of a revised account of free will that remains empirically plausible. Shaun Nichols (chapter 11) then situates Vargas's position in the larger context of a dispute about whether erroneous folk notions should be eliminated or revised. Likewise, Saul Smilansky (chapter 6), Thomas Nadelhoffer and Daniela Goya Tocchetto (chapter 7), Benjamin Vilhauer (chapter 8), and Susan Blackmore (chapter 9) all deal with whether humans should and can live without their illusion of free will and moral responsibility. One almost wonders why there were not subsections to highlight these topical groupings. It is also worth pointing out that while this collection is not aimed at the philosophical novice, the review of the behavioral, cognitive, and neuroscientific material in Part II is not overly technical, making it readily accessible to a non-scientific audience.

The free will debate admittedly is one that, even among some professional philosophers, elicits eye-rolling or not-so-subtle attempts to change the topic of conversation. Some feel that this debate stagnated long ago and so have stopped paying attention. For those who have tuned out the free will literature, there are a few chapters that are novel and well worth your attention. Then for the free will aficionados, at least most of the chapters will be of interest. And for anyone considering assigning this book or portions of it for an upper-level or graduate course on free will, there are several chapters that will be informative and catch students up on much of the state of the debate. This is, in fact, one of the strengths of the collection; there is something here for everyone.

I'll begin by reviewing the chapters that should be of interest to the widest audience. Nichols's outstanding contribution (chapter 11) begins with the assumption that the folk notion of free will is in error because it presupposes the truth of indeterminism. The question is then whether the concept of free will should be revised or eliminated. Since free will is obviously not the first natural kind term to face this problem, Nichols notes that all such debates boil down to whether or not the erroneous folk term in question successfully refers or not. Eliminativists employ a descriptivist convention for reference, according to which a natural kind term refers by means of an associated description. Revisionists, however, maintain a causal-historical convention for reference, according to which an initial baptism set the referent of a term, even if the nature of the object referred to was misunderstood at the time of baptism. Nichols then offers recent experimental evidence that speakers regularly use different referential conventions for different kinds of sentences in which natural kind terms appear. So, when it comes to free will, it is correct to say, "Free will does not exist," since people employ the descriptivist convention in sentences like this one. Nevertheless, it is also correct to say, "Free will isn't what we thought," since a causal-historical convention of reference can be employed for sentences of this type. With this distinction between conventions of reference, both sides can agree that libertarian free will does not exist without precluding the possibility of revision. What is especially appealing about Nichols's "geography of error" and his pluralistic approach is that it can readily be applied to similar debates about other natural kind terms that philosophers care about.

In another intriguing contribution, Bruce Waller argues for a diagnosis of the psychological causes of the persistence of the belief in moral responsibility. Philosophers and the folk, Waller claims, are highly reluctant to abandon their deep-seated commitment to moral responsibility, despite ever growing evidence to the contrary. Thus, Waller takes as an assumption that moral responsibility is an illusion, and instead of arguing why we should give it up, tries to determine why we cling to it so desperately. The main reason, he argues, is a correlated, nonconscious belief in a just world. Philosophers may consciously reject the belief in a just world, but according to Waller it still regularly exerts itself nonconsciously. An example of this nonconscious belief in a just world at work is when people blame rape victims as having invited the attacks. Instances of rape threaten one's belief in a just world, so blaming the victim is a way to preserve that belief. Waller references a number of psychological studies establishing the presence and effectiveness of the belief in a just world. The argument, however, linking it with the belief in moral responsibility is a conceptual one. It would seem that Waller's thesis is empirically testable, and so it will be interesting to see how his claim bears up under future investigation.

The final chapter that is likely to be of interest to those not already heavily engaged in the contemporary free will debate is Mark Hallett's brief but effective discussion of what and when our brains know about what we are doing (chapter 14). Many are familiar with the seminal work of Libet et al. (1983), who found brain activity that caused a bodily movement one second prior to participants reporting that they willed the bodily movement. Hallett surveys this research and the directions in which it has progressed in the subsequent three decades. He then rightly concludes that moral responsibility cannot require consciousness.

The next contributions I'd like to highlight are those that will be of particular interest to free will aficionados. Nadelhoffer and Tocchetto (chapter 7) enter the discussion of the usefulness of disabusing the folk of their erroneous notion of free will. As they note, a number of studies have found that inducing free will skepticism in people correlates with anti-social behavior (such as cheating and aggressive behavior). The implication of these studies is that there are good reasons for letting people continue to believe in nonexistent free will. Nadelhoffer and Tocchetto worry, however, that not enough attention has been paid to the negative effects of believing in free will. They report their results from two studies that find a dark side of free will, namely correlations between free will beliefs and both right wing authoritarianism and just world beliefs. These results are without doubt a significant contribution. Nevertheless, one is left slightly unsure how to fully interpret their findings. Their results only partially matched their predictions, as Nadelhoffer and Tocchetto admit. It is also unclear whether appropriate methodologies were used to limit the Type I error rate (the likelihood of false positives), since they were testing multiple predictions simultaneously using five, multi-question scales in each study. It is also unclear from their present research if inducing free will skepticism in those endorsing right wing authoritarianism would lead to a corresponding drop in right wing authoritarianism. This research program looks to be a promising one, and I look forward to their future work.

John-Dylan Haynes and Michael Pauen (chapter 12) offer an engaging exploration of how and why the concept of intentionality must be revised. For instance, recent neuroscientific evidence indicates that we perform a number of intentional actions without conscious awareness, contrary to the commonsense notion of intentionality that requires conscious awareness. After reviewing the extensive empirical challenges to this commonsense view of intentions, Haynes and Pauen offer a "modest" revision of the concept that comports with psychology and neuroscience. Despite the fact that this modest revision will initially strike most as deeply counter-intuitive, Haynes and Pauen make a compelling case, though the full implications and details of their revision remain to be worked out. One must also appreciate that the scientific material is well presented to a lay readers.

Neil Levy (chapter 5) delivers a noteworthy contribution that continues a specific exchange he and Tamler Sommers have recently begun. Sommers (2012), responding to Levy's (2011) Hard Luck, asserts that by appealing to intuitions about moral responsibility, we do not discover any necessary or sufficient conditions for moral responsibility. Instead, we merely systematize our conceptions, since intuitions about moral responsibility are necessarily culturally relative. Levy here replies that Sommers's meta-skepticism collapses into Levy's own regular skepticism about moral responsibility. Furthermore, Sommers's meta-skepticism undercuts itself, Levy maintains, by relying on culturally relative intuitions as well. Levy has marshaled some intriguing arguments, though Sommers has a number of responses left open to him. So this debate is far from resolved, and it will be interesting to see how it progresses.

Derk Pereboom (chapter 1) has for some time argued for hard indeterminism and continues that argument here. Whether or not causal determinism is true, Pereboom claims, makes no difference to the impossibility of moral responsibility (in the sense of basic deserts). The chapter at times appears to be covering a lot of ground at once (perhaps too much), though it is understandable given that Pereboom is condensing a great deal of his previous work into one chapter. Still, it can serve as a superb text to quickly acquaint students with his view.

Despite the overall quality of the collection, there are a few chapters that all but the most devoted free will scholars can skip without missing much. Galen Strawson (chapter 2), for instance, essentially re-iterates his Basic Argument for the impossibility of moral responsibility. I do not mean to impugn the quality of Strawson's work. Rather, as he has made this argument elsewhere and for sometime, there is not enough new here to attract most readers' attention. Susan Blackmore (chapter 9) argues from personal experience that it is possible (and preferable) to live without the illusion of free will. While I do not doubt the truth of her experiences, her argument apparently extends to the claim that we all should live without the illusion, and this larger argument seems problematic. As Blackmore notes, a number of prominent free will skeptics have told her that they still live as if they have free will because they have to. The trouble with this apparent further claim is that she denies that we have contra-causal free will. So if others live as if they have contra-causal free will while intellectually denying its existence, then by Blackmore's logic, they cannot do otherwise. There seems little that would be capable of causing them to change. If instead Blackmore's contribution is intended only as a personal mediation on living with free will, it can be an interesting read to those wondering if it possible for them as well.

Returning to the collection as a whole, a few concluding remarks are warranted. Given that all but one work is original to this collection and that several chapters focus on various related topics within the general exploration of the illusion of free will and moral responsibility, the reader may sometimes long for more explicit conversation between the authors. At times, it would have been informative and engaging if the author(s) for one chapter were explicitly responding to or developing a thought from another chapter. Instead the book is a collection of independent, though related essays. This is not to criticize any of the chapters on their own merit. Yet, for the free will devotees, due to this editorial decision the collection does give the slight feeling of a missed opportunity for a conversation between so many experts. On the whole, this collection is an excellent contribution to the ongoing free will debate. Those interested or engaged in that debate will find much to appreciate (or argue vociferously against), including those chapters that could not be fit into this review. And even for those readers who only occasionally re-acquaint themselves with this debate, there are certain chapters well worth their time.


Levy, N. (2011). Hard Luck: How Luck Undermines Free Will and Moral Responsibility. Oxford University Press.

Libet, B., Gleason, C. A., Wright, E. W., and Pearl, D. K. (1983). "Time of Conscious Intention to Act in Relation to Onset of Cerebral Activity (Readiness-Potential): The Unconscious Initiation of a Freely Voluntary Act." Brain 106.3: 623-42.

Sommers, T. (2012). Relative Justice: Cultural Diversity, Free Will, and Moral Responsibility. Princeton University Press.